Consciousness in Locke

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Shelley Weinberg, Consciousness in Locke, Oxford University Press, 2016, 240pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198749011.

Reviewed by  Larry M. Jorgensen, Skidmore College


Shelley Weinberg's superb new book on consciousness in Locke addresses many of the puzzling features of Locke's theory of knowledge and his theories of personal identity and moral agency, aiming to show how a proper understanding of the role consciousness plays in Locke's account undoes the several interpretive Gordian knots in each of these areas.

Weinberg takes a systematic approach to the topic of consciousness. Rather than focus primarily on passages that look like they might yield a description or analysis of consciousness, Weinberg focuses on how consciousness is used by Locke. It is quite clear that consciousness plays an important role in the Essays, with Locke's theory of personal identity being the most obvious example. And so Weinberg's account of consciousness in Locke aims to show what a theory of consciousness might look like if it were to do all of the work that Locke needed it to do.

This way of approaching the project leads Weinberg to go beyond what Locke explicitly claims about consciousness. The proof will be in the pudding, since she believes that filling out the account on Locke's behalf provides a fully consistent way of resolving deeper problems in Locke's Essay. As Weinberg says,

because of the paucity of explanation by Locke concerning how he understood consciousness, I have had to fill out the story for him. I suspect that Locke, himself, was not quite sure of his own conception. Nevertheless, once the needed distinctions concerning the nature of consciousness and the work it does for him, we see that other troubling aspects of Locke's philosophy fall into place. (xii)

In particular, Weinberg thinks a fuller account of consciousness in Locke will have significance for well-known and deep problems in (a) the knowledge of individual ideas and of one's own existence, (b) the knowledge of the existence of external world objects, (c) personal identity, and (d) moral agency.

One might worry that approaching the project in this way might risk a post hoc explanation, designed precisely to fill in the very explanatory gaps in these other areas of Locke's philosophy. On the contrary, I think Weinberg's account hews admirably close to the spirit of Locke's philosophy. Even though she is offering a systematic analysis, she remains quite sensitive to textual problems and is concerned that her account remain faithful to the best understanding of the texts themselves. And, at the same time, the systematic approach is fruitful in supplementing Weinberg's interpretations of the texts. Closer attention to the systematic ways in which Locke employs the concept of consciousness recommend alternative readings of the original texts, opening up new and productive avenues of interpretation and research. Since the language of consciousness was undergoing transition during the 17th century, the systematic approach may well be the better way to grasp what Locke intended for his theory of consciousness.

Weinberg, in the Preface, gives us a summary account of what she takes consciousness to be for Locke:

Consciousness is self-consciousness. It is a non-evaluative self-referential form of awareness internal to all perceptions of ideas. It is the perception that I am perceiving an idea, or the perception of myself as perceiving an idea. (xi)

She takes Locke's account to entail that every act of perception is a complex state involving "at the very least, an act of perception, an idea perceived, and consciousness (that I am perceiving)" (xi). To my mind, Weinberg leverages this internal complexity of the occurrent mental state to quite productive ends in spelling out Locke's theory of knowledge. I find its use in personal identity and moral agency somewhat less compelling, but no less provocative.

In the first chapter, Weinberg provides an overview of the development of the modern concept of consciousness in the seventeenth century. As with Locke, she views other philosophers of the seventeenth century as putting consciousness to "philosophical use" without developing a "philosophical understanding" of consciousness (5). Weinberg sketches an account of consciousness on behalf of Descartes, Arnauld, and Cudworth, according to their use of the concept. One main benefit of this is to provide an example of the sort of methodology Weinberg adopts for Locke. As such, I will bypass her interpretation of Descartes, Arnauld, and Cudworth in this review. (More could be said, of course, and I do not yet think we have the full picture of what was going on in the seventeenth century in the development of a concept of consciousness.)

Weinberg ultimately draws a parallel between the views of Descartes, Arnauld, and Cudworth and Locke's views: for each of these thinkers, there are plausible interpretations that align with features that she distinguishes in Locke. In particular, there are plausible interpretations of Descartes and Arnauld where consciousness is understood to be a "reflexive constituent of any thought," which is what Weinberg believes Locke has (or needs) in his own account. These precedents do not provide decisive evidence for her interpretation of Locke, of course, but on the other hand if some of the features of her interpretation were arguably already in operation in his predecessors, it affords her interpretation some historical plausibility.

Chapter two outlines Weinberg's interpretation of Locke's account of consciousness in comparison with some alternative views. Her criticisms of the interpretations that either identify consciousness with perception or identify consciousness with a higher-order reflective act are important background to her own proposal, since each of these interpretations yield incoherence downstream -- neither view coheres with Locke's other commitments. (It seems to me that she is right about this.) If there is an alternative way of understanding Locke's account of consciousness that doesn't yield incoherence with other commitments, then that will be an advantage of the view. And that's what Weinberg sets out to show in the remainder of the book: her own reading of Locke's theory of consciousness as a "reflexive and self-referential awareness internal to ordinary perception" (50) not only coheres with other of Locke's commitments, it also solves several long-standing interpretive problems.

The utility of this account of consciousness becomes apparent in chapter three, the core of the book. There is no way I can do it full justice in a brief review. I'll simply point to the central piece of Weinberg's solution to several troubling aspects of Locke's theory of knowledge. She argues that each perception has a complex propositional structure, which grounds sensitive knowledge. In any perceptual act, there are at least three constitutive components: the idea that is the object of sensation, the idea of existence, and consciousness (which is reflexive and involves a reference to the self). For inclusion of the idea of existence, Weinberg quotes II.vii.7, although II.vii identifies several other such ideas to be "annexed" or "joined" with sensation, ideas like unity, pain and pleasure, and power. And so if we are to take her proposal, every sensation will have a rather elaborate internal structure. Weinberg focuses only on the idea of existence, since this is what enables her proposal to solve the main difficulties in Locke's theory of knowledge.

When I perceive, say, the color white, the following proposition is present to mind in the single act: "the idea is as I am perceiving it to be" (78). This complex proposition thus provides two modes of presentation of the idea: a phenomenal mode (the idea as it is presented to me in my first-personal conscious experience of the idea) and the existential mode (the existence of the idea). Following Locke's definition of knowledge as the perception of agreement or disagreement of ideas, Weinberg argues that the perception of an individual idea yields knowledge of that idea since there is an internal complexity to the perception that can yield an agreement. She concludes, "knowing our own ideas . . . is due to perceiving a complexity of mental content, each part of which makes a contribution to the state of affairs as equally expressed in any of the family of the relevant true propositions" (78).

Weinberg leverages this internal complexity to solve problems with knowing one's own existence and knowing the existence of external things (provided we have the relevant internal and external justifications for knowledge). Likewise, she shows how her proposal allows for a very interesting analysis of Locke's response to the skeptic. Given her account of the first-level complexity of sensation, sensitive knowledge appears to be just as certain as intuitive knowledge, since, on her proposal, the knowledge of the existence of external objects is not inferential. However, Locke regards intuitive knowledge as more certain than sensitive knowledge. Why? The reason sensation is less certain than intuition is not because it fails to yield knowledge at the first-order level (it does) but because it fares less well in satisfying second-order normative conditions. Namely, sensitive knowledge is susceptible to second-order doubts in a way that intuitive knowledge is not (see p. 133).

When Weinberg turns towards Locke's theory of personal identity, she identifies three criteria that an interpretation of Locke's theory of personal identity should avoid: "The general problem seems to be that Locke needs an objective criterion for the continued existence of the person in order to avoid circularity, be sufficient for divine rectification, and maintain logical transitivity" (152). And since Locke has rejected the views that ground personal identity in substance, these problems have proven difficult. Weinberg claims to be able to solve all three "without incurring any costs" (153). The key to her reading of II.xxvii is to recognize that in the chapter on identity Locke is ambiguous in his use of the term "consciousness." Weinberg claims that "Locke seems to see consciousness as (1) a mental state inseparable from an act of perception by means of which we are aware of ourselves as perceiving, and (2) the ongoing self we are aware of in these conscious states" (153). The first refers to the "momentary conscious states," while the second refers to the "objective fact of ongoing consciousness" (153). By being more attentive to how consciousness is being used, we will be able to avoid the traditional problems with Locke's theory of personal identity:

Disambiguating these two senses of consciousness allows for a metaphysical fact, what I am also calling an 'objective fact,' of my diachronic existence. Thus, there is no problem of circularity or transitivity, and there is a metaphysical ground for Locke's theory of divine rectification. God need only look to all that I, as a continuously existing consciousness, have done to determine my just punishment and reward. (153)

There are two odd results (at least to my mind) of Weinberg's proposal. The first is the introduction of a new ontological category sandwiched somewhere between substance and passing mental states. Of course, Locke separates person from substance, which is in part what raises the traditional difficulties. If substance grounded personal identity, then there would already be a "metaphysical fact" that would resolve the difficulties. Instead, according to Weinberg, Locke is arguing for an enduring consciousness, consciousness as a persisting self, that plays the needed role for an underlying ontological object without bringing in the heavy-duty metaphysical baggage: it is something "objective" (in her sense, accessible to third-party assessment) without being substantial. Weinberg raises several good questions about the ontological status of this enduring consciousness, which receive what -- to my mind -- are less than satisfactory answers. In the end, she says that "we do not need a full account of consciousness in order to know that we have (there is) one and that it is distinct from our fleeting perceptions of ideas" (160). Locke simply doesn't seem to have the resources to provide an answer to the question about the metaphysical status of an enduring consciousness. (Weinberg does discuss further an account of "real constitutions," which she think is a bit more illuminating.) And yet on Weinberg's accounting, Locke needs to appeal to an enduring consciousness in order to solve problems of personal identity. And so while she downplays this ontological commitment, it is not at all clear to me just what Locke -- on this reading -- is committing himself to.

The second problem has to do with terminology. I might ask, first of all, why Locke would have introduced this radically different notion of consciousness without signaling it, especially when there are other terms that could have worked just as well (e.g., person, self, rational being, thinking being). While it seems clear to me that there are places where consciousness = conscious being (which might imply an enduring self), some of the passages that Weinberg cites seem difficult to read this way. For example, she cites the "same consciousness extended" in II.xxvii.9 and 10 as instances of the second usage. However, in both cases, immediately prior in the same sentence is a usage of consciousness as accompanying momentary mental states, and so to read the "same consciousness extended" as a reference to a self rather than consciousness of momentary thoughts over time would mean that Locke changes his meaning within a single breath. And there are many such instances in II.xxvii where it would be unclear which meaning is intended. The famous case of the drunk person who has forgotten what he has done is another instance, shifting from the second meaning back to the first and then to the second again in one sentence. Weinberg explains this passage by saying that the continuous (ontological) consciousness is something that we may not always know -- sometimes we are not conscious of our consciousness. That is to say, there is a "metaphysical fact" about themselves of which the drunk person is not occurrently aware.

None of this is decisive -- the language of consciousness, as I have already noted, was undergoing transition in the seventeenth century, and its meaning was quite often ambiguous. Weinberg's interpretation has many advantages. My own difficulty is reconciling it with all of the relevant texts.

At any rate, the final chapter again drops the notion of consciousness as a "metaphysical fact," and instead appeals to the experience of a unified self as necessary for moral responsibility for past actions (on the human level) and for concern and motivation to act well in the future. And so, for Weinberg, the discussions of continuity of moments of consciousness extending backwards and projecting this consciousness forwards is more relevant for motivation and agency than it is for personal identity. That is, my concern for myself is not directed at an underlying metaphysical enduring consciousness. Rather, it is directed at myself as I am conscious of myself, unified with my present experience.

I hope that it is obvious by now that this is a rich and stimulating book! I have sketched what I take to be some of the key proposals, but there is much that I have left out. This book is important to Locke scholarship as well as to those who are interested in the history of theories of consciousness. One thing I have not yet mentioned is the clarity with which Weinberg argues her case, always ensuring that the problems are well understood before venturing a proposal and positioning that proposal within the current literature on Locke. It is a model of good historical scholarship.