Placeholder book cover

Christopher S. Hill, Consciousness, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 264pp., $30.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521125215.

Reviewed by Daniel Stoljar, The Australian National University


Christopher Hill's first book Sensations (Cambridge University Press, 1991) contained one of the first and best statements of a view in philosophy of mind that in the 1990s became orthodoxy within the field, a view sometimes called 'a posteriori materialism' or 'type-B materialism' (for the latter terminology, see David Chalmers, The Conscious Mind, Oxford University Press, 1996). A posteriori materialism (as I will call it here) has two parts. The first part, the materialist part, says (in its simplest form) that every instantiated mental property is identical either to some physical or to some topic neutral property. The second part, the a posteriori part, says that mental concepts are distinct from (in the sense of not being a priori equivalent with) any physical or topic neutral concept. The attractiveness of this two-part view is that it seems able to undermine the key arguments against materialism such as the knowledge argument (KA) and related arguments. These arguments certainly establish, says the a posteriori materialist, the truth of the second part of a posteriori materialism, the part that says no mental concept is a priori equivalent with any physical or topic neutral concept. But they do not establish the falsity of the first part, materialism, and a fortiori do not show the falsity of a posteriori materialism.

That orthodoxy has now collapsed. While a lot of philosophers still think that a posteriori materialism is true, many now agree that its key elements do not provide the materials to answer arguments like the knowledge argument, and that these materials will have to be found (if at all) elsewhere. As such, it does not dominate the field as it once did, and many of the key proponents have now recanted. The latest is Hill himself. "For a period of seventeen years, beginning in 1984", Hill tells us on p. 56 of his new book Consciousness, "I was confident that conceptual dualism could be used to undercut the arguments for property dualism," where 'conceptual dualism' is, roughly, Hill's name for a posteriori materialism. Indeed, Hill goes on to say (fn. 27, p. 50) that he himself was the first to state the view, in 1984. This is unlikely since the view was already being discussed critically in the literature in 1980; see, e.g., Frank Jackson "A Note on Physicalism and Heat," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 58 (March): 26-34. But even if he was not actually the first, Hill was certainly among the first, and this lends his change of heart considerable interest.

Consciousness has nine chapters. The first four introduce the topic, explain why Hill gave up a posteriori materialism considered as an answer to the arguments against materialism, and set out what he thinks is the best successor theory. The last five chapters apply this successor theory to a large variety of different topics, including visual perception, pain, emotions, and perhaps most interestingly introspection. The writing is in general clear though it is sometimes extremely compressed. For example, I would be surprised if readers will not be put off by the first paragraph of the book that does not flinch in presenting five different notions of consciousness in a single sentence!

Why has the a posteriori materialism orthodoxy collapsed? Different philosophers are moved in different ways. Some question the theory of the necessary a posteriori that underlies the view. Some find the concept/property distinction (or at least its use in this context) unclear. Some think that proponents of the view need to be committed not only to a distinction between concepts and properties but to a special sort of concept, a phenomenal concept, which (they think) may not exist. Some agree that phenomenal concepts exist but think that the a posteriori materialist who appeals to them will not be able to answer the knowledge argument, or at any rate not without 'answering' lots of other arguments that seem perfectly sound, e.g., the perfect actor argument against behaviorism.

Hill's reason is none of these. He argues that a posteriori materialism fails to answer KA and other arguments because it holds, as he says, "awareness of qualia always involves conceptualization" (p.54). To bring this out, suppose I see the colors on the facing surface of an apple in daylight. According to Hill, I am in this case aware in a certain kind of way of the colors of the apple. However, the awareness is not of the sort that allows me to express in language the properties I am aware of and is in this sense 'non-conceptual' in two main ways. First, the richness of the properties I am presented with might elude my capacity to name them in words. Second, when I am aware of one particular color I am aware of a particular shade of that color, but may well have no name in my language for the specific shade that it is. Of course, it might be that I could use demonstrative language to capture the richness and specificity of the properties I am aware of, by using expressions like 'those colors', 'that particular shade' etc. But Hill says that the use of demonstratives in this way presupposes a non-conceptual form of awareness. Since a posteriori materialism presupposes that awareness of qualia is conceptual (this is its "central conception", Hill says on p. 54), it is to be rejected.

There is much that is attractive in this line of thought, but unfortunately I doubt it does much to undermine a posteriori materialism's ability to answer the arguments for dualism. For one thing, Hill is fairly brief on the point that the use of demonstratives presupposes a non-conceptual form of awareness; maybe it instead brings a conceptual form of awareness into being, or maybe it presupposes a form of awareness that while not being expressible in language is nevertheless conceptual in a different sense -- 'conceptual' is a very slippery word after all. But more importantly it is unclear that the thesis that awareness of qualia is conceptual is a central contention of a posteriori materialism as Hill claims. When Hill states the view he calls 'conceptual dualism' (and I have called 'a posteriori materialism') he says it is combination of three views: (a) that one's awareness of qualia is conceptual; (b) that mental and physical (including topic-neutral) concepts are distinct; and (c) it is possible to exploit these facts to defend materialism. Clearly, that one's awareness of qualia is conceptual is a central contention of the conjunction of (a-c). And of course Hill is free to define any view he likes. However, if we mean the view that held sway over the philosophical community for a period of seventeen years, it is much less clear that a claim about the conceptual nature of awareness of qualia is central to it. In particular, so far as I can see (a) plays no role at all in (c). It is true that arguing about qualia requires having some sort of conceptual representation of qualia, but instantiating (or being aware of) qualia need not. More important, nor need any proponent of a posteriori materialism suppose so.

Even if Hill's reason for rejecting a posteriori materialism is open to question, he does seem to be on good ground when he rejects it, at least considered as an answer to the arguments against materialism. But what is the answer to these arguments that he wants to put in its place? The general idea is a form of intentionalism or representationism about mental states in which the notion of representation is explicated, as the material just discussed would suggest, in a non-conceptual way. In particular, Hill's suggestion is that conscious states consist in a non-conceptual form of awareness of qualia. So, for example, when I see the colors on the facing surface of an apple in daylight, I am aware in a non-conceptual or experiential sense of these colors.

Once again, there is a lot that is attractive in this line of thought, but I doubt it will move those attracted to conceptual dualism. The problem is not the appeal to a non-conceptual form of awareness or representation; as Hill's discussion clearly shows, this has a good deal of plausibility to it (though like anything else it is not completely uncontroversial). The problem, rather, is why the appeal to this form of awareness will in any way undermine the key arguments against materialism. Take the knowledge argument, which says (to put it very simply) that materialism is false because it is possible to know all the physical facts and yet not know all the facts. (Jackson's Mary is the best illustration of this possibility.) Hill says, in effect, that the premise is false, or at any rate is not supported by the case (pp. 119-120). It is not true that it is possible to know all the physical facts and yet not know all the facts; rather, all that is possible is to know all the physical facts and have a new experience. So in particular when Mary comes out and sees an apple for the first time she will have a non-conceptual form of awareness for the first time, but she will not learn anything new.

How plausible is this as a response to the argument? Well, it is certainly true that Mary will have this new experience. Likewise it is true (if Hill's theory is right) that she will therefore be non-conceptually aware of a property. But this by itself does not solve the problem, as Hill himself notes (p. 119). For the intuition that drives the argument does not rest on the claim that Mary has a new experience; everyone will agree with this. Nor does it rest on any particular philosophical analysis of what an experience is; any philosophical theory of experience had better entail that Mary has a new experience on coming out, since it is quite clear that she does so. Rather the knowledge argument rests on the intuition that Mary learns something on coming out, that is, that she comes to know something that she did not before. It is this intuition (or rather this intuition combined with the intuition that she knew everything physical) that needs to be confronted by a response to the knowledge argument.

Does Hill confront this intuition? Well, as I understand him, Hill tries to undermine this intuition by suggesting that the proponent of the argument (and Mary) has confused the case in which she has a new experience for the case in which she has a new experience and learns something new. But it is not at all clear that this confusion strategy is successful. For one thing, while we might have a tendency to confuse these cases, it is not clear that we must do so. Hill himself has disentangled them after all; why should the proponent of the argument not do likewise? For another thing, Hill's attack focuses on one feature of the Mary example -- its reliance on new or novel experiences -- and it is quite unclear that the knowledge argument requires examples that involve novel experiences. This is the point of 'Experienced Mary' variants on the original case, variations which have been pursued in detail by a number of authors -- for discussion, see, e.g., Alex Byrne's review of There is something about Mary, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews 2006, and the references therein.

I have concentrated on the parts of Hill's book that focus on the arguments for and against property dualism, for this seems to me where much of its drama lies (particularly given Hill's earlier work). Concentrating just on this, I have found a lot to be critical of. But focusing on this does not do justice to the richness of Hill's discussion. Hill covers an enormous amount of material here, and a lot of what he says is not only instructive and interesting: it is separable from issues about materialism. It is these parts of the book that make me think that Consciousness will be as widely read as Hill's other work in philosophy of mind; it is certainly as deserving.