Consent to Sexual Relations

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Wertheimer, Alan, Consent to Sexual Relations, Cambridge, 2003, 310pp, $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521536111.

Reviewed by Stephen Kershnar, SUNY, Fredonia


Alan Wertheimer’s book, Consent to Sexual Relations, is an important investigation of consent to sex. The book contains many interesting and insightful arguments and does a nice job of distinguishing the considerations that are relevant to moral and legal consent. The book is both broad and narrow. It is broad in that it discusses a broad array of interesting issues, including the psychology of rapists, the types of psychological harm that rape victims suffer, the moral status and nature of consent, and the conditions that make consent invalid. The book is also narrow in that it focuses on issues surrounding consent to sexual relations, rather than the broader issue of rape and other sex crimes. The book consists of arguments for the following five theses.

First, Wertheimer argues that valid consent is sufficient to make sex morally and legally permissible (chapter 6). His argument is that other conditions (e.g., reciprocity) are not required for a number of reasons, most prominent of which are the value of autonomy and the plurality of goods that might rationally motivate a person to want to have sex. Wertheimer notes that this thesis does not require that morally permissible sex be immune to moral evaluation. He also points out that administrative reasons (e.g., concern for privacy and the difficulty in gathering reliable evidence on things other than valid consent) support making valid consent sufficient for legally permissible sex.

Second, Wertheimer argues that nonconsensual sex is harmful and morally wrong because of the experiential suffering that accompanies and follows it (chapter 5). He argues that nonconsensual sex is harmful because it impairs a woman’s ability to function and because it causes her distress. The latter involves fear and terror that accompanies and follows the event. The distress includes second-order distress, distress that derives from the belief that someone is violating one’s rights. Here Wertheimer’s summary of the psychological evolution of our attitudes toward sex in chapters 3, 4, and parts of 5 helps to explain why nonconsensual sex is so damaging. He argues that since wrongfulness is a function of expected harm, culpability, and perhaps actual harm, persons who culpably have sex with non-consenting women perform very wrongful acts. Citing harm-principle considerations, he suggests that the harmfulness of nonconsensual sex in part explains why it should be criminalized.

Third, Wertheimer argues for the performative view of moral consent (chapter 7). On this account, an agent consents if she expresses consent in the appropriate manner. This is in contrast to the subjective view (a person consents if she has the relevant mental state) and the conjunction of the subjective and performative views. Wertheimer argues that the purpose of consent is to allow one to change her moral relations to another, thereby altering the latter party’s reasons for action. This can only happen, he argues, if one indicates her will to do so. There are probably also pragmatic arguments to adopt this account in the legal context, although Wertheimer does not explicitly defend this claim. Along the way, he has an interesting discussion of the slogan “’no’ means ’no’.”

Fourth, Wertheimer provides an analysis of valid consent (chapters 6, 8-11). He argues that consent is morally valid if and only if the agent is competent and her consent is neither coerced nor deceived. His argument is that consent that results from coercion or deception prevents a person from being able to engage in sex on the basis of a decision about her interests and values. Wertheimer’s analysis of deception is inconclusive but interesting. He points out that deception raises different issues than coercion. He discusses the traditional legal distinction between fraud in factum (a person is deceived about what is done) and fraud in the inducement (a person consents to intercourse but deceived about some of the facts surrounding it). An example of the former occurs when a gynecologist tells a woman he will be inserting an instrument into her vagina and instead inserts his penis. An example of the latter occurs when a man induces the woman to have sex by lying about his intention to marry her. Wertheimer argues that the distinction is hard to apply and not morally relevant. He argues that from a moral perspective, there is good reason to think that we should take deception more seriously than we typically do. He ends up suggesting, however, that something like a caveat emptor (let the buyer beware) legal principle might emerge as the principle that should govern sexual relations.

Fifth, Wertheimer argues that whether someone should consent to sex is not merely a matter of her desire for sex but also a function of her goals and the interests of her partner (chapter 12). His argument consists of pointing out the plurality of good reasons to engage in sex that are unrelated to a participant’s desire (e.g., expression of love and the attempt to have a child) and his argument that the principles of distributive justice apply to sex and marriage. So, for example, a married woman may in some cases have a strong reason to have intercourse (and perhaps even an obligation) even where she doesn’t desire to do so.

Wertheimer’s analysis has some defects. The first defect relates to his claim that sex to which the participants have validly consented is not immune to moral evaluation (pp. 130-131). Wertheimer’s claim here is interesting only if he means that there are right-making factors in addition to valid consent. If, instead, he means that the goodness of sex is not solely a function of valid consent, this is trivially true. This can be seen in that the goodness of sex is probably a function of the pleasure it brings about or the motive that accompanies it and obviously sex differs along both dimensions. One wonders how the rightness of sex might be a function of things other than valid consent. In particular, one wonders whether Wertheimer thinks that the Kantian imperative (an act is morally right if and only if the agent refrains from treating a person merely as a means), which appears to motivate Wertheimer’s emphasis on valid consent (pp. 127-130), has room for other right-making factors. It might be the case that Wertheimer thinks that there are right-making factors not captured by the Kantian imperative. Oddly, Wertheimer almost completely ignores the issue of sexual exploitation, despite having written a superb book on exploitation. Wertheimer appears to be caught in a dilemma here. If the rightness of consent to sexual relations depends on things other than valid consent, then his first thesis is false. If this is not the case, then the notion that validly consented-to sex is still subject to moral criticism (understood in terms of rightness or permissibility) is false.

The second defect involves Wertheimer’s model of morally valid consent. Wertheimer adopts an interest model of morally valid consent to sex whereby valid consent is the conclusion of moral argumentation about whether it’s in someone’s interest to hold that she (or the relevant class of persons) has validly consented in that type of situation. This can be seen in part in the conjunction of the notion that rights in part determine whether a person has validly consented (see chapter 8 where he adopts a rights-based account of coercion) and the notion that rights protect interests broadly construed (pp. 100-102). On this account, then, valid consent is a result of the conclusion of reasoning about interests. Wertheimer is not as clear as one might hope in delineating whose interests are relevant in determining principles of valid consent. For example, in the case of heterosexual rape, are only the victim’s interests relevant or are the interests of other women and some men also relevant?

In contrast, one might adopt an autonomy model of morally valid consent to sex whereby valid consent depends on whether a person autonomously decided to have sex and appropriately expressed this decision. This model, unlike the interest model, does not look at the consequences of regarding a person’s consent as valid. In practice, the interest and autonomy models won’t differ much since autonomy-related interests are central to an individual’s network of interests. However, the two models differ theoretically. This can be seen in two areas: reasoning about morally valid consent and right-waiver cases.

The first theoretical difference between the models concerns how one reasons about morally valid consent in particular cases. Wertheimer’s interest model approaches such cases by looking at the net balance of interests for an individual or group (for now, leave aside the issue of whose interests). The autonomy model looks more narrowly at whether a particular individual made an autonomous decision and appropriately expressed it. Consider the following case, which is a variant of one of Wertheimer’s cases (Spiked, p. 235).

Spiked #2. A first-year college student, B, attends a fraternity party for the first time. There is a bowl of punch that has been “spiked” with vodka but is labeled nonalcoholic. B has several big glasses of punch. She is unaware that the punch is spiked and as a result unaware that the alcohol has seriously distorted her judgment and significantly lowered her inhibitions. Male A, who is not part of the fraternity and who does not recognize that B’s judgment is distorted, proposes that they go to his dorm room. They do and have intercourse.

We intuitively reason in the following manner. B’s decision was seriously distorted in a way that she did not anticipate. Hence, her consent was not autonomous and thus it was not morally valid. We then take this conclusion to be a datum in deciding whether A was morally or legally blameworthy for having sex with her. This is exactly what the autonomy model would recommend.

Wertheimer might claim that the autonomy model confuses consent for which the agent was morally responsible with valid consent. However, if valid consent does not track morally responsible consent then its purpose is unclear. It can’t merely pick out consent that makes resulting sex permissible since this would make Wertheimer’s first thesis (morally valid consent is sufficient for permissible sex) trivially true and he argues for this position.

On the interest model, we have to reason more broadly. Specifically, whether B gave morally valid consent depends on a balancing of interests. The issue arises whether we should focus on B’s interest, the interests of women in B’s position, A’s and B’s interests, etc. Wertheimer does not give us a clear answer to this issue, nor can he. Let us assume that he focuses on B’s interests alone. The balance of B’s interests does not necessarily track whether and the extent to which B was morally responsible for her consent and appropriately expressed it. Rather, the balance of B’s interests (and those of similarly situated women) is relevant to the assessment of other issues such as whether we should label A’s actions as wrongful, punish A, criticize B, etc. Let us assume that Wertheimer instead focuses on the interests of women in this type of situation or women in general (or perhaps an even larger grouping). On this interpretation, the issue of whether B gave morally valid consent will likely depend on a consequentialist analysis of which rule about consent brings about the best results. This misses the point. It also prevents us from saying that in some cases, consequentialist reasons override morally valid consent, and we want to be able to say this. In addition, Wertheimer should tell us whether we should consider interests from an ex ante, ex post, or statistical perspective or at least what are the guidelines by which we determine which are relevant.

An illustration of this problem can be seen if we attend to Wertheimer’s comments on retarded women. Wertheimer holds that in determining whether retarded women can give morally valid consent, it is relevant to consider whether non-retarded men are taking advantage of them and whether they will have the opportunity to experience intimacy and sexual pleasure (p. 225). Again, neither is relevant to whether retarded women have the capacity to give such consent and appropriately express it.

If our focus is on legally valid consent, Wertheimer is in better shape. It might be the case that such drunken consent should not result in A being punished because he is not culpable or because we want to provide bright-line incentives for women not to drink. It seems misleading to justify this legal rule on the basis that B gave legally valid consent, but this might be a perspicuous way of stating the rule. Wertheimer should then acknowledge that legally valid consent need not be accompanied by morally valid consent since it is the lack of culpability not consent that explains why A’s actions are legally permissible.

The autonomy model can also provide a better account of where persons obligate themselves to have sex. Consider this variant of one of Wertheimer’s examples (Ulysses, p. 156).

Ulysses 2. A, a man, and B, a woman, join the “Ulysses” club which hosts events where all parties sign a form indicating that no one will be legally liable for any sexual act, including forced sex. Both individuals are competent and give informed consent. One can ask another to refrain, but one has no recourse if he does not. A approaches B. B resists. A enlists the help of others to hold B down.

On the autonomy model, at least one where persons can waive most or all of their moral rights, B gives morally valid consent not to sue A for his actions. There may be consequentialist or paternalistic reasons why the law shouldn’t recognize this waiver, but it seems intuitively incorrect to assert that B didn’t give morally valid consent. In contrast, the interest model can’t as easily account for the scenario as one where we override B’s morally valid consent. Wertheimer might want to describe this situation as one in which B gives morally-valid second-order consent to others to have sex without her morally-valid first-order consent. This move, however, does not clearly fit with his interest model and only raises the central issue in this context, which is whether a person can morally bind herself.1

Despite these problems, Alan Wertheimer’s book is important because of the care of his analysis and the array of interesting arguments. The book ought to receive widespread attention and respect. I expect that it will.2


1. For an argument in support of this claim, see Stephen Kershnar, “A Liberal Argument for Slavery,” Journal of Social Philosophy 34 (2003): 510-536.

2. I am grateful to Alan Wertheimer for his helpful comments and criticisms of this review.