Consequences of Reference Failure

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Michael McKinsey, Consequences of Reference Failure, Routledge, 2020, 155pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367363109.

Reviewed by Ulf Hlobil, Concordia University


(a) It was not necessary that Europa be abducted by Zeus. (b) Indeed, we cannot know -- much less know a priori -- that she was abducted by Zeus. (c) After all, Europa doesn't exist, and never did. (d) Hence, there is someone who doesn't actually exist. (e) But surely, there doesn't exist anyone who doesn't actually exist. . . . Mhh?

Meinongians accept all of these claims except (e). They say that Europa exists but is not actual. It seems intuitively more plausible, however, to reject (d). But doesn't (d) follow from (c)? Descriptivists about proper names say that "Europa" means "the woman who was abducted by Zeus and became the first queen of Crete." Hence, (c) is synonymous to "No one is the woman who was abducted by Zeus and became the first queen of Crete." That blocks the inference from (c) to (d). As Kripke has taught us (at least for referring names), however, descriptivism cannot make sense of the truth of (a) and (b). After all, ignoring reference failure, it is necessary and knowable a priori that the woman who was abducted by Zeus and became the first queen of Crete was abducted by Zeus.

Today, many philosophers accept the so-called Direct Reference thesis (DR), according to which if a proper name or indexical occurs in a sentence, then it contributes merely its referent to the expressed proposition. Does DR allow for a plausible account of (a)-(e)? Unfortunately, it cannot make sense of the truth of (a)-(c). After all, if "Europa" has no referent, what does it contribute to the proposition expressed by "Europa doesn't exist"? How can sentences with empty names be true? I'll call this the "Empty-Truths Problem." In addition, there is the classic Fregean problem that, e.g., "Livia believed that Cicero denounced Catiline" can be true while "Livia believed that Tullius denounced Catiline" is false. How is this possible if "Cicero" and "Tullius" make the same contribution to the two propositions? Michael McKinsey calls this the "Substitution Problem."

In this book, McKinsey offers solutions to these problems for DR. His first key contribution is a particular neutral free logic that implies, e.g., that "Europa didn't exist" -- along with (a) and (b) -- is neither true nor false unless "Europa" is used in an unusual way. His second key idea is that names can be used, in unusual cases, as short for descriptions. When "Europa" is used in this way, (a)-(c) are all true. However, this is allowed only in "a small subclass" of cases (p. 2). A striking upshot is that there is a hitherto unnoticed class of a posteriori necessities, namely sentences that are necessarily true if the names that occur in them refer in the actual world.

To set the stage, note that McKinsey's topic is the logical treatment of potentially non-referring proper names and indexical pronouns in English. He focuses on the semantics of names (their contributions to truth conditions) and not metasemantics. He suggests that the referents of names are fixed by associated descriptions but doesn't discuss this in detail. He doesn't offer any account of the role that intentions or historical chains of usage play in reference-fixation. Furthermore, McKinsey presupposes that logic applies straightforwardly to English without considering the possibility that logic provides merely abstract and idealized models of some limited aspects of natural language (Peregrin and Svoboda, 2017; Shapiro, 2014). Nor does he seriously discuss the Fregean view that, at least in scientific contexts, the use of empty names in natural language needs reform. I think this framing of the issues, though initially disappointing, was probably the right choice, given McKinsey's project.

The book is well structured and written in a clear and economical style. I will go over McKinsey's main theses, focusing on points where reasonable doubt remains despite his insightful contribution.

Chapter 1 is an historical overview of the semantics of proper names and indexicals, and focuses on Russell, Frege, and Kripke. The upshot is that we should accept the DR thesis for typical uses of names and indexicals, and that the Empty-Truths Problem and the Substitution Problem pose the two greatest challenges.

In Chapter 2, McKinsey observes that DR implies that sentences containing empty names do not express propositions and, hence, lack truth value. His main argument is that empty names cannot be used to say anything about the world. Since some meaningful sentences of natural language contain empty names, and logic should apply to all meaningful sentences, we must adopt a neutral free logic, which deems sentences in which empty names occur neither true nor false. The two main flaws of classical logic, according to McKinsey (p. 46), are (i) that it deems sentences like "Obama exists" logical truths, and (ii) that it deems arguments like "Everything is either to my right or to my left; therefore, Europa is either to my right or to my left" valid. He thinks it is "downright absurd" (p. 31) to hold that "Obama exists" expresses a logical truth; it is "a contingent proposition that is possibly false" (p. 31). McKinsey ensures that ◊¬x(=Obama) is satisfiable in his logic. However, it is worth noting that, since "Europa" doesn't refer, both ◊∃x(x=Europa) and "Europa exists" lack truth value, according to McKinsey. Thus, none of (a)-(c) above are true. To capture the intuition that (a)-(c) are true, he later claims that "Europa" is ambiguous and can sometimes contribute a description to propositions. One may wonder why the intuition that "Obama exists" isn't logically true should have so much more weight than the intuition that "Europa exists" is false.

Chapter 3 gives a semantics for McKinsey's preferred neutral free logic. The propositional part is weak Kleene logic, following Lehmann (1994, 2002). The only designated truth value is "true," as in Bochvar's logic (Bochvar and Bergmann, 1981). It is crucial for McKinsey that sentences containing empty names be meaningful. Hence, he cannot interpret the third, infectious truth value as "nonsense" or "meaningless," as is common for weak Kleene logics (Beall, 2016). Rather, he must interpret it as "lacking truth value," an interpretation that is not obviously plausible. According to the weak Kleene truth-tables, if any part of a conjunction or disjunction has the third truth value, then so does the whole conjunction or disjunction. But shouldn't we say that "Either Merkel is the chancellor of Germany or Europa liked spinach" is true, supposing that "Europa liked spinach" is meaningful (regardless of its truth value), because Merkel is the chancellor of Germany? And shouldn't we say that "Four is a prime number and Europa liked spinach" is false, if "Europa liked spinach" is meaningful, because four is not prime? Following Lehmann, McKinsey thinks this is wrong because truth-functions shouldn't have outputs if some input is missing. That puts a lot of weight on a particular notion of truth-functions and what counts as an input.

McKinsey doesn't mention some facts about his logic that may be helpful. For example, its propositional fragment has no theorems, no logical truths (like the strong Kleene logic K3). The "source" of all logical truths is that, in models with empty domains, sentences of the form "∀x(Fx)" are true and sentences of the form "∃x(Fx)" are false. If such sentences lacked truth value, then such models would be counterexamples to any potential logical truth.

It is unfortunate that McKinsey never discusses which, if any, truth values should be designated. If McKinsey had followed Halldén and Prior, rather than Lehmann and Bochvar, and taken "true" and the third value to be designated (and if he disallowed empty domains), his logic would coincide with classical logic in its theorems, like Priest's LP does (Ciuni and Carrara, 2016). And if McKinsey had rejected the idea of designated truth values and taken an argument to be valid if there is no model in which its premises are true and its conclusion false (and if he disallowed empty domains), his logic would coincide with classical logic in its theorems and its consequence relation, like the non-transitive logic ST does (Cobreros, Egré, Ripley, and van Rooij, 2012). McKinsey doesn't argue against such options, but he rejects the idea that a sentence could be a logical theorem without being true (pp. 32-33). It appears to me, however, that once we allow for a third truth value, it should be a matter of decision or expedience whether we think of logical theorems as sentences that are true in all models or sentences that aren't false in any model, and mutatis mutandis for the validity of arguments. Given that McKinsey's departure from classical logic rests entirely on not taking these routes well-traveled by advocates of LP and ST, it may be an overstatement that McKinsey's view leads to "radically non-classical concepts of logical truth and logical consequence" (p. 54).

McKinsey departs from Lehmann in not forcing his quantifiers to be bivalent. His arguments are interesting and compelling. However, I have a methodological quibble: McKinsey objects to Lehmann's treatment of the quantifiers because it implies that ¬x(x=Pegasus) is true while ∀x(∃y(y=x)→x≠Pegasus) is false. He calls this "a distinction without a difference. It just seems obvious that the English sentences in question ('Pegasus does not exist' and 'No existing object is Pegasus') are logically equivalent" (p. 58). But McKinsey's logic seems to raise a similar objection when it comes to the scope of quantifiers (p. 83). According to McKinsey (and Lehmann), ∀x(∀y(y=x)) z(z=z) (in which the first universal scopes just over antecedent) and ¬z(z=z) entail ¬x(∀y(y=x)), but ∀x(y(y=xz(z=z)) (in which the first universal scopes over the conditional) and ¬∃​​​​​​​z(​​​​​​​z=zdo not entail ¬∀​​​​​​​x(∀​​​​​​​y(​​​​​​​y=x)). I cannot find two distinct readings of these arguments in English. Why does the "no distinction without difference" principle rule out Lehmann's but not McKinsey's view?

In the third section of Chapter 3, McKinsey extends his logic to cover alethic modals. He argues that while many classical logical truths are not theorems of his logic, they can be a posteriori necessary truths. If the name "a" refers in the actual world, then Fa∨¬Fa is necessarily true (p. 70). Otherwise, it is neither true nor false. Since we cannot know a priori whether "a" refers, Fa∨¬Fa is an a posteriori necessity (if "a" refers). In opposition to Zalta, McKinsey considers an argument valid if it is truth-preserving in all worlds in all models, rather than merely in the actual world in all models. McKinsey argues his general notion of validity yields more plausible results, and he rejects Zalta's view that sentences of the form (Aφ&¬φ), where A is an actuality operator, are logically false while some instances of ◊(⋄(Aφ&¬φ) are satisfiable. Notice, however, that according to McKinsey, sentences of the form ¬∃x(x=a) are either false or lacking truth value in the actual world of all models, while instances of ◊¬∃x(​​​​​​​x=a) are true in the actual world of some models. So logical falsehoods that are possible are deal-breakers, but logical untruths that are possible aren't deal-breakers. The reason for this remains somewhat unclear.

In Chapter 4, McKinsey considers and rejects alternatives to neutral free logic. He offers compelling discussions of Braun, Salmon, and subsitutionalism. He admits he cannot do justice to Routley's Meinongianism (p. 96). His main objection is that nonexistent objects cannot be individuated in any satisfying way; this point, while strong, seems inconclusive.

Chapter 5 contains McKinsey's solution to the Empty-Truths Problem. McKinsey's view is that "natural languages contain idioms in which in a few types of contexts, names can be used as short for descriptions" (p. 140). In that use, names contribute to propositions the descriptions that normally merely fix their referent. According to McKinsey, this can happen in three kinds of context: sentences about existence, sentences about cognitive states, and sentences involving names from mythology. Following Currie, names from fictions are treated by appeal to what a "fictional author" believes.

McKinsey closes with his solution for the Substitution Problem. He holds that when "Hesperus" and "Phosphorus" are used as genuine names, then "The ancients believed that Hesperus appears in the evening" and "Hesperus is Phosphorus" entail "The ancients believed that Phosphorus appears in the evening" (p. 137). However, when these names are used as short for descriptions, the inference is blocked. This solution applies immediately only to names used as short for descriptions (p. 139). Drawing on work by Rieber, McKinsey suggests it can be combined with the idea that names in attitude ascriptions occur as implicit "complex quotations." He thinks, e.g., that "Sally believes that 'Archibald Leach' was a famous movie star" means "Sally believes that 'Archibald Leach' refers to someone who was a famous movie star." I wonder whether this idea applies smoothly to Kripke's famous Paderewski case, in which Pierre doesn't realize that Paderewski the politician and Paderewski the pianist are the same person. "Pierre believes that Paderewski [the pianist] had musical talent" is true while "Pierre believes that Paderewski [the politician] had musical talent" is false. McKinsey would have to say either that at least one occurrence of "Paderewski" is short for a description or that it is false that Pierre believes that "Paderewski" refers to someone who had musical talent. Both options are implausible because Pierre's belief that Paderewski had musical talent is not a trivial belief like "This musically talented person has musical talent," and the second option requires that Pierre possess two distinct names spelled "Paderewski." Thus, one may reasonably doubt that McKinsey's solution to the Substitution Problem applies to names that are not short for descriptions.

The book contains interesting ideas and compelling arguments. However, little of it will resonate for a reader who doesn't accept the following conjunction: sentences that contain empty (genuine) names are meaningful in a way that requires that logic apply to them, and such sentences fail to express propositions. A detailed discussion of the relation between meanings and propositions would have been helpful. McKinsey says that Strawson and Cartwright have "conclusively corrected" the error of confusing "a sentence having a meaning in a language with the sentence expressing a proposition in that language" (p. 33). McKinsey seems to think of the meaning of an assertoric sentence as something that determines truth-conditions relative to contexts of use, barring reference failure (p. 51). By contrast he seems to think of logic as concerned with truth-conditions. If that is right, it is not clear to me why the fact that empty names have meanings and can figure in meaningful assertoric sentences implies that our logic should apply to them. Why is it not good enough for our theory of meanings to apply to empty names? What have we gained by having a logic that applies to empty names? If McKinsey's logic could explain why "There is someone who doesn't exist" doesn't follow from "Europa doesn't exist" or the like, that might be useful. But according to McKinsey, the argument is valid (because there is no model in which the premise is true). In conclusion, while I remain unconvinced regarding several key points, McKinsey's book is a valuable contribution to the debate about names and reference failure, and I warmly recommend it.


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