Consequentialism and Environmental Ethics

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Avram Hiller, Ramona Ilea, and Leonard Kahn (eds.), Consequentialism and Environmental Ethics, Routledge, 2014, 194pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415823807.

Reviewed by Martin Peterson, Eindhoven University of Technology


Some environmental ethicists believe that traditional, anthropocentric moral theories cannot be successfully applied to environmental problems. The reason is that anthropocentric theories (by definition) place humans at the center of the ethical discourse, not the environment. Consequentialism and Environmental Ethics can be read as an attempt to correct this misunderstanding. Not every version of consequentialism is anthropocentric, and as several contributors point out, some or all of the often very strong claims defended by non-anthropocentric thinkers can be expressed in a consequentialist framework. By doing so it becomes easier to understand, articulate and critically evaluate non-anthropocentric claims.

The volume contains eleven chapters. The first five address axiological issues in environmental ethics and the remaining six ones in environmental decision making. In what follows I shall focus mainly, but not exclusively, on the five chapters that deal with axiological issues.

Katie McShane discusses two familiar but fundamentally different notions of value in environmental ethics. Following Parfit, she contrasts the consequentialist notion of value-to-be-promoted with the Kantian notion of value-to-be-respected. She asks: "in the context of climate change, what does the difference between thinking of our jobs as trying to make the world as good a place as possible and trying to act in ways that express respect for the value of things we are in relations with amount to?" (p. 29) McShane's conclusion is that the consequentialist notion of value should be preferred in discussions of climate change because it is better suited for situations that are new and unfamiliar to us. The Kantian account might be a good description of how most people think about value in everyday situations, in that it emphasizes emotional attachments and relationships with others. The consequentialist notion of value is often psychologically difficult for people to adapt to. Despite this, the latter is preferable "under conditions of rapid and serious climate change" because we will soon be living in very unfamiliar circumstances, in which emotional attachments and relationships with others will be less relevant (p. 30).

One worry I have about McShane's position is that it sometimes sounds as if we could choose if we want to be consequentialists in one domain (environmental ethics) but remain Kantians in other domains. But how could it possibly be that we ought sometimes, in some domains of applied ethics, make the world as good a place as possible, at the same time as we, in other domains of applied ethics, ought to act in ways that emphasizes emotional attachments and relationships with others? It makes little sense to be a Kantian on Mondays and Tuesdays, but a consequentialist for the rest of the week. The most charitable interpretation of McShane is perhaps that she takes the problems for Kantians to deal adequately with climate change to show that Kantianism is the wrong approach altogether.

Robert Attfield's chapter is a response to a book review by Alan Carter, in which Carter raises a number of objections to Attfield's book. The review appeared in print more than a decade ago. I believe this will be of interest mainly to people who have previously read Attfield's book and Carter's review. I shall make no attempt to adjudicate whether Attfield's criticism of Carter is valid.

Avram Hiller develops and defends a new version of consequentialism called "system consequentialism". In my opinion, this is one of the most interesting chapters. Non-anthropocentric thinkers such as Aldo Leopold, Arne Naess, Holmes Rolston, and J. Baird Callicott have argued that systems are morally important in their own right and not just as a means to an end. Consequentialists have traditionally denied this, but Hiller's ambition is to formulate a version of consequentialism in which entire (eco)systems are evaluated, not just sentient beings. Hiller's argument for ascribing moral properties to systems is based on an analogy with sports. He asks us to imagine an athlete who takes a performance enhancing drug that makes it easier to win some competition. Even if the drug is not prohibited, and has no negative side effects, the intrinsic value of winning the competition would, according to Hiller, be lower if the performance enhancing drug is used. The intrinsic value of one part of the system, the victory, depends on whether the athlete took the drug or not, not just on the intrinsic properties of the victory itself. According to Hiller, this shows that we should assign intrinsic value to the system as a whole (the entire competition), not just to the victory.

Here is a worry I have about Hiller's argument: What makes holistic views in environmental ethics interesting is that they articulate a reason for, at least sometimes, performing acts that will only benefit non-sentient beings, at the expense of humans and other sentient beings. We should sometimes preserve an entire ecosystem even if that ecosystem does not matter to us or any other sentient being. Hiller's consequentialist view is surely compatible with this holistic claim, but he does not give us any positive reason for thinking that our own wellbeing should sometimes be sacrificed in return for benefits for non-sentient beings. As Hiller formulates his view, system consequentialism is compatible with the claim that human wellbeing always trumps other considerations in the final consequentialist analysis. But environmental holists typically wish to resist that claim. Therefore, in order to ensure that his theory actually captures the holistic intuition it was designed to capture, it seems that Hiller also has to show that the anthropocentric elements of the system do not always trump the non-anthropocentric elements.

Alan Carter articulates and defends a view he calls multi-dimensional consequentialism. This, briefly put, is the axiological claim that the overall value of a world is a function of more than one contributory value. Carter lists three such contributory values: the number of worthwhile lives, the average level of utility, and equality. An alternative and perhaps more familiar name for this type of view is value pluralism. In my book The Dimensions of Consequentialism (Cambridge University Press 2013) I also defend a view I call multi-dimensional consequentialism. The view I call multi-dimensional consequentialism is, however, very different. My version is a claim about an act's deontic status, i.e., its rightness or wrongness. It is not an axiological claim. Traditional consequentialist views such as utilitarianism and prioritarianism are one-dimensional in the sense that an act's deontic status depends on just one moral aspect, e.g., the sum total of wellbeing it produces, or the sum total of priority-adjusted wellbeing. In so far as Carter makes a claim about the rightness or wrongness of acts, his view is one-dimensional: an act is right iff it brings about at least as much overall value as every alternative act. In the alternative terminology suggested in my book, multi-dimensional consequentialism is the view that an act's deontic status is a function of two or more irreducible aspects. On this view, wellbeing and equality cannot be merged into some composite aspect that accurately reflects both considerations. Such clashes between conflicting moral aspects are irresolvable. Moral rightness and wrongness are, as a consequence of this, non-binary concepts. Some acts are, literally speaking, somewhat right and somewhat wrong. This is not the right occasion for discussing which account of multi-dimensional consequentialism is the most plausible one. But it is worth keeping in mind that Carter's multi-dimensional consequentialism is very different from at least one other multi-dimensional consequentialist theory.

Ben Bradley discusses a number of arguments for thinking that wilderness has intrinsic value. He argues that no argument is convincing. One of the points he makes is that several arguments for ascribing intrinsic value to wilderness boil down to claims about its instrumental value. According to Bradley, Rolston's argument for why we should not impose human culture on wild animals is that doings so harms the animals, not that the interference is bad in itself. If we could interfere with wild animals without harming them, that would be permissible, which shows that it is not wilderness itself that is the bearer of intrinsic value. In my view, Bradley's critique is convincing.

Let me finally comment on one of the six chapters that address issues related to environmental decision-making. Krister Bykvist discusses decision making involving evaluative uncertainty: what should you do when you are uncertain about your evaluative (as opposed to factual) judgments? Perhaps you think that both humans and non-humans are bearers of intrinsic value, but you are not sure how valuable a human life is as compared to that of a pig or a dolphin. Bykvist focuses on a way of dealing with this problem proposed by Michael Zimmerman, which Zimmerman calls Value Vacillator Consequentialism (VVC). On this view one should maximize an act's expectable value, as opposed to its expected value. An act's expectable value is an increasing linear function of three variables: the possible values assigned to the outcomes of an act, the probabilities of the outcomes, and the probabilities that each alternative value assignment is correct. Bykvist objects to VVC on the grounds that it identifies an act's right-making features with the evidence we have for our factual and evaluative hypotheses, not with how things actually go. According to Bykvist, this is a reason for rejecting the view. What makes an act right or wrong is how things actually go, not what our evidence for various factual and evaluative hypotheses happens to be. Bykvist then goes on to propose a very simple alternative to VCC: "I think we should stick to traditional consequentialism and say that cases of evaluative uncertainty are in fact also cases of moral uncertainty in which we risk doing wrong" (p. 128).

Another alternative to VVC, which Bykvist mentions, but does not discuss in depth, is to claim that moral rightness varies in degrees. If the evaluative probability is high that an act will have at least as high an expected utility (as calculated in the traditional way), then the act is right to a high degree, but not entirely right. A possible objection to this proposal could be that we again identify an act's right-makers with the evidence we have for various evaluative and factual hypotheses. But note that we could avoid this problem (if it is a problem) by instead rejecting the idea that the relevant probability function has to be an evidential probability function. I agree that I do not understand what it would mean to say that evaluative probabilities should be interpreted as relative frequencies or propensities (and a strict subjective interpretation would run into the same problem as the evidential one), but this may not exhaust the set of possible interpretations of the probability calculus. Why not just claim that the debate over evaluative uncertainty makes it plausible to think that there also exists a special kind of evaluative or moral probabilities, which differ in certain respects from physical propensities, subjective degrees of belief, and the degree to which a hypothesis is supported by its evidence? It is quite widely accepted that no single interpretation of the probability calculus can capture all our intuitions about probability judgments, so why not just introduce a new interpretation that suits our needs in this domain and claim that such probabilities should be included in the list of an act's right-making features?

My overall impression of this volume is that it contains several thought-provoking ideas that deserve to be seriously considered by scholars interested in environmental ethics. The level of argumentation is high, and the authors mean exactly what they write. However, if I were to say something negative, I could perhaps point out that some of the contributors merely treat environmental issues as illustrations of more fundamental problems for consequentialist theories. It would perhaps have been better to focus a bit more on environmental issues and a bit less on general, foundational issues related to consequentialism.