Conservative Reductionism

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Michael Esfeld and Christian Sachse, Conservative Reductionism, Routledge, 2011, 204pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415891868.

Reviewed by Cliff Hooker, University of Newcastle, Australia


Esfeld and Sachse aim to provide an account of the laws of the special sciences (biology, sociology, etc.) where, in the face of their multiple physical realisation, every instance is fully reducible to physics yet the laws themselves retain an independent scientific status and explanatory value. That is what is meant by 'Conservative' in the book title. Is this trying to have your cake and eat it too? Here is their summary of how the trick is done, from chapter 5, the last in the book:

The starting points are token identity and completeness of physics. Multiple realisation or multiple reference conceived as an anti-reductionist argument leads to a dilemma, because thus conceived multiple realisation or multiple reference undermines the systematic connection between the special sciences and physics, and the special sciences are poised to lose if they enter into a conflict with physics. Against this background we have shown that the causal theory of properties enables us in any case of multiple reference to conceive more fine-grained functional concepts and laws of the special sciences -- so-called sub-type laws -- that are coextensive with those of physics that seize the complex local physical structures that are identical with property tokens of a special science. Since co-extension is sufficient for reduction, this step grounds on the one hand a possible scientific quality of the sub-type laws that does not come into conflict with the completeness of physics, but that on the other hand does not prevent these sub-types from being eliminated in favour of physical concepts and laws, since they do not add anything to the descriptions and explanations of what there is in the world that is not already provided by physics. By abstracting from details as regards the ways in which the significant effects in question are brought about, it is possible to get within a theory of the special sciences from the sub-type laws to the corresponding abstract laws. These are thus linked with physics without being threatened by elimination, since physics is not in a position to build concepts that seize all and only those structures that have significant effects in common under certain environmental conditions, although they are composed in different manners.

Consequently, multiple reference no longer constitutes an anti-reductionist argument. It is possible to derive the laws of the special sciences by abstraction from the sub-type laws that are reductively linked with physical laws through nomological co-extension. These abstract laws and the abstract concepts . . . reveal natural kinds, since they seize salient similarities in the effects that certain local physical structures have under normal conditions. (pp. 160-161)

There is a slight but pervasive oddness to the English, of which 'seizes' = captures and 'abstract laws' = general laws are examples in the quoted passage. And this oddness occasionally combines with a tendency to prolixity to make understanding more difficult (e.g., the second half of this quote). But the exposition is always careful and mostly very clear, so that a little patience removes any reader problems.

Against the summary above, the preceding chapters fall into place. Chapter 1 argues that, while functionalism has aimed at conservative reductionism, it has not heretofore succeeded. This is because, in the presence of multiple realisation, previous versions of functionalism (causal role and realiser functionalisms) face the fatal dilemma that the laws of the special sciences wind up either epiphenomenal (causal role) or eliminated (realiser). Chapter 2 develops the authors' causal account of properties to be applied within a functionalist account. Chapters 3 and 4 apply these ideas to the special science of biology, first for evolutionary process (ch. 3) and then for classical or transmission genetics (ch. 4). Chapter 5 then sums up.

As noted, the challenge is to figure out how to defend the laws of the special sciences as having scientific legitimacy ('quality') while still insisting that all of their diverse instances are token-by-token completely reduced to physics. And, as their summary above makes clear, their key to doing so is a distinctive causal theory (not causal role theory) of properties. Apart from that factor, their position looks rather like old functionalism: they agree to token-token reduction, that multiple realisation removes type-type reduction and with that a common physical grounding for special science laws, eliminating the laws or leaving them epiphenomenal phantoms. So the issue is how the causal theory of properties rescues their position from being just a repetition of old functionalism, and thus from sharing its fate.

How this trick is to be brought off is not obvious. Any natural kind, a fortiori one captured in the special sciences, needs some kind of causal (better: dynamical) grounding that explains its claimed constant causal capacities as more than an accident, and physics must ultimately provide that grounding. But in the face of token-token reduction to physically diverse tokens how can that grounding possibly be found?

With respect to the quote above, it is not enough to point to the construction of specialised forms of a law of the special sciences that, over a restricted domain, is type-type reducible to correspondingly specialised laws of physics, for this in itself cannot ground the general law of which they are instances. Old causal role functionalism did this much and the authors reject it as inadequate. Nor is it enough to claim that we can obtain the general laws by abstraction from the more particular, reducible ones, for without causal-dynamical grounding of such abstractions they remain merely generalisations, perhaps accidental, perhaps not.

Nor, as the authors go on to suggest, can this issue either be finessed by weakening the notion of a natural kind, extending it to any term that turns up in a law-like role in a special science by requiring only that "members of a natural kind have to have natural properties in common" (p. 163) or by setting it aside as "simply a matter of the division of scientific labour" (p. 161). Not by weakening, because it begs the question of whether the laws of special sciences require any grounding beyond simply appearing as law-like generalisations. And not by setting aside, as if physics had no common type reductor only because it was too busy, or too turf-respecting, to construct one, because the issue is whether physics can in principle construct a common causal basis for a type-type reduction, and either it can or it cannot -- and, if not, how then does law-like status accrue to the general laws of the special sciences?

There is a hint of a different sort of appeal: "the causal similarities [sic] that the special sciences point out depend in such a way on environmental conditions that physical differences do not lead to functional differences." (p. 163) Well, yes, that is the desired kind of explanation, but what provides it? Specifically, what causal-dynamical condition, common to all the instances, grounds it? It is precisely with this question, unresolved, that chapter 4 concludes, leaving us with the various unsatisfactory versions above from chapter 5. The answer is of some moment, because the essence of the authors' critique of functionalism is just that it cannot provide any such grounding, so its functional generalisations are epiphenomenal.

[Causal] role functionalism faces the . . . problem . . . that it is not intelligible how the role properties can be causally efficacious . . . [since] the presence of functional role properties indicates that there are other properties, the physical realiser properties, that produce certain effects. (p. 16)

The critique of realizer functionalism is similar.

What it would be for a functional property to be causally efficacious is not made clear, but I assume it to mean that it is somehow guaranteed that every relevant input condition causes the functionally specified output condition to be produced. This surely requires some common underlying causal condition ensuring the operation of the function. The alternative would be for a diverse collection of such conditions to guarantee that all future instances of the function would be thus supported -- but how could this be, since we have multiple instantiation again, albeit a higher order version, but that will not prevent the authors' functional epiphenomenalism from recurring. So, the authors' "environmental conditions" need to somehow generate a common causal condition guaranteeing functionality; but I cannot see where the authors clarify what that is, e.g., for genetics in chapter 4, though much of their discussion suggests this topic.

There is a potential model for it found in recent work by C.A. Hooker (the present reviewer) on reduction that addresses the dynamical generation and explanation of multiple realisation.[1] Hooker's model is the diverse triggering conditions for a Geiger counter leading to the same electrical pulse as output. Here the function is 'respond to triggering inputs in class T with pulse output P'. The multiple instantiation of input but same function is guaranteed by the counter construction that provides higher-level dynamical constraints that filter out the lower-level dynamical input variations. Such constraints can (causally-)dynamically ground functional laws, since they explain why, how and when all the diverse instances must have the same effects. The authors' "environmental conditions" are reminiscent of such constraints. Though the authors' conditions are more general than the counter's single output, clearly the notion of higher-level dynamical constraints extends to encompass filtering out disturbances to the underlying production processes/mechanisms, even with variety in both input and output.

Under those conditions, Hooker contends, functions holding can be contingently identified with their constrained dynamical production processes holding, that is, with their causally stabilised physical mechanisms holding, despite the variety of inputs and outputs, and reduced accordingly. (Like the authors, though much more sketchily, Hooker discusses the dynamical conditions for the transmission-to-molecular genetics reduction case that the authors discuss in chapter 4, his initial three conditions setting up the physical constraints required for defining the bio-synthetic pathway mechanisms/functions.) The constraints themselves represent an irreducible dynamical condition, a new dynamical entity (e.g., a Geiger counter) and this is quite generally so. Thus, for Hooker functional reduction is always accompanied by irreducible emergence. However, maximal naturalisation is obtained since both the irreducible constraints and the reduced functions are natural dynamical entities among the same physical components. Is this perhaps what the authors intend, or should have intended?

A corollary to Hooker's account is that laws of the special sciences are all condition-dependent, dependent on the relevant dynamical constraint conditions obtaining (Philosophy of Complex Systems, ch. 27). Nomological condition-dependence makes clear the distinction between genuine, but limited, laws and accidental generalisations, however broad in scope. The authors' saying that they all hold only ceteris paribus does not make that distinction. Given the causal completeness of physics that the authors accept, it must be dynamics itself that (conditionally) entails that multiple realisation occurs, just as it entails that new dynamical entities (conditionally) emerge. For Hooker, strictly speaking, a precursor to naturalised functional reduction is requiring that properties are clarified through mixed ontological-functional re-analyses (effectively defining causal role functionalism for the authors) and are regimented, as the authors also contend, into determinable/determinate hierarchies that match up functional sub-types with dynamical process sub-types, representing two further parallels between the two expositions. In both these cases and the genetics example Hooker's constructions were initiated in Part III of an earlier trilogy on reduction.[2] For their part, the authors refer (p. 27) only to Part I and only to dismiss it as a progenitor of later causal role functionalist reduction.

The authors find no explicit role for (dynamically) irreducible constraints and eschew use of mixed ontological-functional analyses as causal role functionalism. Instead they develop their own causal (but evidently not causal role) theory of properties (ch. 2) and suppose that it supports them in both these stands. According to their chapter 2, properties are something like stable structures of causal potentia or capacities, the capacities to bring about particular causal effects in particular environments under particular stimuli (cf. field theory). The discussion above then raises in a sharpened form these issues:

  1. How can the causal structures theory of properties address the provision of a ground for the causal efficacy of the functions of the special sciences?

The answer suggested by their line above about the causal enabling role of environmental conditions is that it is achieved through grounding a function in a common stable causal structure whose capacities match those of the function. But then

  1. Why not consider the function reduced to the causally specified underlying process?

In that case,

  1. How does that position differ from Hooker-style causal role functionalism with functions grounded in higher-level constraints that stabilise mechanisms?

So far as I can see the first two issues are never clearly resolved, though they lie behind the discussions of the biology examples in chapters 3 and 4, and the third issue is untouched. It is beyond the scope of this brief review to pursue these questions into either the detail of the authors' exposition or the parallels and differences with Hooker's position.

There are a variety of other, less central issues that also emerge from this discussion, such as the authors' contention that "co-extension is sufficient for reduction" (see quote at outset) when it would seem that nothing short of (contingent) identity is required and whether their principle of the causal completeness of physics holds in the face of irreducible dynamical emergence. And beyond these is the issue of why the authors devote so much space in chapters 3 and 4 to providing detail about evolution and genetics that is well known and seems largely beside the point. Why, e.g., devote a lengthy discussion to how to define life, at all, and why finally select the capacity to undergo variation, selection and retention as demarcation, when that process clearly characterises many non-living entities (and, some would argue, nearly all processes), while ignoring work on autopoiesis/autonomy as defining life that can at least ground the notion of proper biological function they also seek (see Hooker, Philosophy of Complex Systems, chs. 9, 11, 1, §4 and references). And why focus on just proper functions when a much more general notion is needed to capture all biological processes (that is, to match all mechanisms)?

Generalising field-theoretic properties as a basis for functional laws is an intriguing idea and deserves further development. However conservative reduction is best achieved, this book is recommended as a thought-provoking re-assessment of ontology for contemporary physics, and of functional reduction in the special sciences.

[1] "Asymptotics, Reduction and Emergence", British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 55 (2004), pp. 435-479, §5; cf. Hooker (Ed.), Philosophy of Complex Systems, Elsevier, 2011, ch. 7.

[2] "Towards a General Theory of Reduction", Dialogue 20 (1981), pp. 38-59 (Part I); pp. 201-236 (Part II); pp. 496-529 (Part III).