Conspiring with the Enemy: The Ethic of Cooperation in Warfare

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Yvonne Chiu, Conspiring with the Enemy: The Ethic of Cooperation in Warfare, Columbia University Press, 2019, 344pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231182454.

Reviewed by Jovana Davidovic, University of Iowa


War is an exercise in brutality defined by the breaking of ordinary moral norms. Yet, over and over again, history presents us with cases of enemies seemingly ignoring what war requires of them and cooperating with each other sometimes against their own interest. In this book, Yvonne Chiu examines this phenomenon.

Theorizing about ethics of war far too often lacks reference to real-life lessons. This in turn often results in theories of war that cannot be straightforwardly used for decision-making in war, and accounts that are so far removed from practitioner's experiences that they get ignored. Ignoring the reality of war also often leads to blind spots regarding whole sets of ethical questions about war. Such is the case with ethic of cooperation in warfare. Chiu's account of the ethic of cooperation in warfare is both inspired by and carefully informed throughout by real-life examples spanning millennia. She addresses a number of questions about the ethic of cooperation in war, circumscribing the topic of cooperation in war rather broadly to include a wide range of exceptions to brutality of war (xii).

In chapter 1, Chiu discusses a range of topics in an effort to paint a background for her empirical and philosophical project. These include analogies to evolutionary theory, game-theoretical approaches, the legitimizing effect of cooperation in war, and the formalization of cooperation in war in the form of international humanitarian laws. Most centrally, Chiu offers a working definition of cooperation. She rejects a purely game-theoretic approach to cooperation largely because such an approach ignores instances of cooperation that are self-detrimental and motivated by virtue and altruism. She instead offers a rather broad definition of cooperation with an aim of teasing out shared features among a range of wartime activities that counteract brutality in war. Cooperation, on that understanding, includes cases in which one sees oneself as cooperating (whether or not others do), as well as cases of working jointly with others "with the intent to achieve an end that is beneficial to somebody" (21). Ultimately, for Chiu, cooperation doesn't require "communication, collective agency or planning, positive sentiment, shared goals, or even mutually beneficial outcomes, [nor] does it preclude selfish motivation" (22-23). Cooperative intent broadly understood is all that is needed to pick out cases worthy of analysis, Chiu argues.

With such an understanding of cooperation, Chiu focuses the rest on three kinds of cooperation, arranged around their purpose. In chapter 2, she discusses cooperation for a fair fight; in chapter 3, cooperation to minimize damage to particular classes of people; and in chapter 4 cooperation to end war quickly with an aim of minimizing overall damage. She examines how the ethic of cooperation underpinning these kinds of cooperation has affected warfare more generally and she argues that the first and the second kind of cooperation might actually undermine the fundamental goals of war.

In chapter 2, Chiu argues that parity in risk and opportunity and a kind of procedural and sporting notion of fairness are the best ways to explain the ethic of cooperation for making war a fair fight. She also discusses ways in which this notion of cooperation for a fair fight exhibits in warrior honor codes and professionalism as well as in prohibitions on some kinds of surprise and deception both in war and prior to war. An important tension that emerges out of this discussion is the likely prolongation of war and thus harm to others that results from embracing and cooperating for a fair fight.

In chapter 3, Chiu considers enemies' cooperation to minimize harm to particular classes of people (centrally, civilians). This includes a discussion of how and why the ethic of cooperation drives, both historically and as a reason for action, the international humanitarian laws that require discrimination and are designed to minimize harm to civilians- including laws governing wearing of uniforms, POW treatment, weapons bans, etc. As in chapter 2, Chiu examines not only on the positive outcomes of the ethic of cooperation in the service of minimizing harm to civilians (via underpinning rules that protect non-combatants), but also acknowledges that sometimes fighting in this way could in fact make war last longer and thus be more damaging.

In chapter 4, Chiu discusses the case of cooperating to end war. In many ways, this is the centerpiece of the book's prescriptive element, as here she starts to build the argument for the claim that cooperating to end the war swiftly might be preferable to cooperating for a fair fight or to minimize harm to civilians. She acknowledges that the cases of cooperating to end a war are few and far between and are often far back in history, but nonetheless thinks that we ought to consider cases of cooperation to end the war quickly.

In the last three chapters, Chiu continues examining these three types of cooperation. She acknowledges that many of the cases that she discusses might seem disparate, but nonetheless argues that the way these ethics of cooperation interact, as well as the ways they inform the various rules and norms of war (including just war rules and international law) are significant and uncover some significant flaws with humanitarianism-driven attempts to minimize the worst of harm in war.

In chapter 5, Chiu examines similarities, differences, and tensions among the three ethics of cooperation. She also delves deeper in the realm of unintended consequences of cooperation, especially cooperation for a fair fight and for minimizing harm to groups of people. She argues that both of these ethics of cooperation can at times make it harder to win the war, making Chiu "question their proper relationship to the goal of warfare itself (to yield a political settlement or a justicial decision)" (162). The second of the two, the so-called 'protective ethic' of cooperation to minimize harm to some groups of people in war can at times contravene its very intention, she argues.

In chapter 6, Chiu considers the relationship of the ethic of cooperation to other principles of warfare -- specifically just war principles and principles of international law. She argues that the very superstructure of modern war is informed by the ethic of cooperation because the ethic of cooperation (a) explains the political nature of war, (b) explains the international community's single-minded emphasis on jus in bello principles in war, and (c) can explain the way states work together to define legitimacy in war (193). Through discussion of (b) Chiu continues to push forward the suggestion that we ought to seriously re-consider the fair fight and 'protective ethic' elements of norms of warfare (and especially their instantiations in international law) and instead try to focus on the ethic of cooperation to end war quickly and the role it can play in structuring war in the first place.

Finally, in chapter 7, Chiu surveys the lessons learned from her analysis of the ethic of cooperation. Having argued that the ethic of cooperation drive key norms in war (just war principles and international norms as well as their over-focus on jus in bello norms), she argues that this can explain why so little progress has been made on the "fundamental function of war . . . to yield a 'correct' or just outcome beyond a modus vivendi" (234). She argues this is, in part, because the ethic of cooperation for a 'fair fight' and the 'protective ethic' have found their way into international law -- prolonging wars and making them thus more harmful.

Chiu's book examines a fascinating phenomenon that has no doubt been understudied. One of the key strengths of her approach is also one of the key weaknesses -- namely the breadth of wartime phenomena that she considers to be 'cooperation'. Chiu analyzes various disparate features of warfare including fairness in fighting, professionalism, weapons bans, discrimination principles, truces, sieges, duels, etc., and attempts to connect these varying elements of war and principles of war with an ethic of cooperation. At times this leads to new insights, but by forcing them all into the framework of the ethic of cooperation and by analyzing them all through the same lens, she seems at times to misrepresent some key elements of those phenomena while producing a framework that is bursting at the seams trying to accommodate too much.

This is likely the result of the way Chiu conceptualizes 'cooperation'. she approaches the question of an ethic of cooperation by engaging in a dialectic process between theory and practice. Given this, it is more than reasonable that she does not provide us with a practice-independent account of cooperation, i.e., in many ways the fact that there isn't a highly-theorized account of cooperation early on in the book is a healthy by-product of the approach she takes. However, one is left wondering what exactly brings together all the examples and types of "cooperation" she discusses. Commonly, in cases such as this one, while an author is given some leeway to develop the account/concept through the examples and dialectic with practice, nonetheless, the concept does in the end need to be clear.

Chiu illustrates many of her general points about cooperation in war by examples, but never do we get an argument explaining why we ought to think of cooperation in her sense rather than another. For example, there are numerous examples of soldiers in WWI trenches refusing to shoot an enemy soldier out for a cigarette, or one not wearing clothes, or one simply unaware of the danger. These examples which she considers 'cooperation,' often instead seem to be simple cases of mercy, or empathy, or humanity. One is left with an impression that she thinks that not engaging in violence whenever one has strong war-reasons to do so is a case of cooperation. In fact, early on Chiu suggests that "the sum of the exceptions to the brutality of war is more than its constituent parts, and they add up to an ethic of cooperation between enemies in warfare" (xii). The fact that all cases of choosing not to engage in the brutality of war share some features is not surprising. Also, the suggestion that many of these cases are motivated in part by a cooperative intent is also highly plausible. However, the attempt to claim that this small subset of joint features (that all those cases share) is somehow able to explain most if not all principles and norms that guide war as well as the superstructure of war is more worrisome.

One of the key claims Chiu makes is that cooperation to minimize harm to civilians can make war deadlier and more harmful. She argues that this 'protective ethic' of cooperation has driven the international community to over-focus on rules that govern how we fight wars (jus in bello rules) and under-focus on why and how we start wars (jus ad bellum rules). But as I suggested above, trying to explain war norms and their current standing primarily by reference to an ethic of cooperation might lead one to miss out on essential driving forces behind such norms. Specifically, when it comes to jus in bello rules, their prominence and the international community's emphasis on these rules is, in large part, driven by a) the fact that jus in bello norms including discrimination, proportionality, and necessity parallel well-established domestic norms, and b) the fact that the international human rights law (and the growing jurisprudence of international human rights law) has been infiltrating and leading to a reinterpretation of international humanitarian laws (in a way that places attention on rights of individuals). Both of these forces have played a significant role in how jus in bello norms have emerged and why they seem to be the central focus of the international community when it comes to war. Once a person acknowledges these driving forces, she has more reason to think and accept that the value of humanitarian jus in bello laws extends far beyond the protection of life in war and can play a significant role in establishing robust norms that protect life in a range of circumstances. And if that is the case, then even if Chiu is correct in thinking that the ethic of cooperation to protect civilians might lead to more damaging wars, we would still have good reason to hold on to and promote this ethic since it might nonetheless cause less harm overall.

Chiu's book provides an insightful and original argument supported by robust historical illustrations. Particularly valuable is that it restructures and shines new light on topics we might have thought we had already examined and understood while providing a decidedly new framework for re-examining them.