Constructing the World

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David J. Chalmers, Constructing the World, Oxford University Press, 2012, xxvi + 494pp., $29.95 (pbk) ISBN 9780199608584.

Reviewed by Tom Donaldson, Stanford University


This is a monumental book, in several respects. Most obviously, it’s very long: longer, by my estimate, than the Critique of Pure Reason by a margin of about three and a half Tractatus. It is also vast in scope: Chalmers discusses a huge range of topics in formal and informal epistemology, metaphysics, the philosophy of language, the philosophy of mind, and the philosophy of science. There is even some history: Carnap is the ‘hero’ of Constructing the World (p. xvii), and one of Chalmers’ goals is to reassess Carnap’s work — especially the Aufbau.

Paper copies of the book contain eight chapters and seventeen short supplemental ‘excursuses’. Chalmers has also made one extra chapter and four additional excursuses available online. The book is based on Chalmers’ 2010 John Locke lectures, which the Oxford University philosophy department has to its great credit put online in mp3 format. Chalmers has made no major changes to his position or terminology between delivering the lectures and completing the book, so those who like to take their philosophy aurally can start with the online lectures before turning to the written text for more detail.

Trying to summarise this mammoth book in a review of this length is like trying to draw a road map of greater London on the back of a postage stamp with a crayon. But here goes.

In the Aufbau, Carnap began with a minimal language, containing only logical terms and a binary predicate, which expresses the phenomenal relation of ‘recollected similarity’. He then added further terms to his language by explicit definition, thinking that all meaningful terms could in principle be so defined. A central thesis of the book was that all truths may be deduced from truths in the minimal language, given the relevant definitions. Chalmers accepts the received view, which is that this central thesis is false. However, Chalmers argues that there are nearby claims (‘scrutability theses’) that are true, with roughly the form:

There is a small set of truths, with conjunction D, such that for all truths S, ˹If D then S˺ is a priori.

So, according to Chalmers, Carnap may have been wrong, but he was not as far wrong as many people think. Chalmers finds very many applications of his scrutability theses. In this review, I won’t have the space to discuss all of these applications.1 Instead, I’ll only consider the application that Chalmers himself most emphasizes: his Fregean theory of sense.

In section one I discuss Chalmers’ use of the vexed term ‘a priori’. In section two I discuss Chalmers’ defence of the claim that there are a priori truths (including synthetic a priori truths) from empiricist doubters. In section three I explain how Chalmers defends his ‘scrutability theses’. In section four I outline the Fregean theory of sense.

1. Chalmers' definition of 'a priori'

Apriority is often supposed to be a property of propositions, but not wanting to pre-judge difficult questions about what propositions are, Chalmers usually takes apriority to be a property of sentences (pp. 42-47). In this way, one can say that ‘Hesperus is Hesperus’ is a priori while ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is not, without having to worry about whether the two sentences express the same proposition. Eccentrically, Chalmers often uses words like ‘believe’ and ‘know’ to refer to relations that obtain between people and sentences. For example, in Chalmersese one might say:

Chalmers believes ‘Carnap was a great philosopher’.

This way of speaking may be unusual, but Chalmers argues that it is not philosophically objectionable: in his third excursus, Chalmers develops a theoretical account of what it is to believe a sentence. The ‘sentences’ that Chalmers discusses are not always sentences of natural language. For example, Chalmers sometimes talks of ‘sentences’ that are infinitely conjunctive. He draws his sentences, not from English, but from an idealized language with expressive power beyond that of natural languages. Chalmers’ definition of ‘a priori’ is otherwise fairly standard:

A subject s knows [a sentence] S a priori iff s knows S with justification independent of experience.

[A sentence] S is a priori (for [a subject] s) iff S can be known a priori (by s). (p. 468)

‘Can’ here doesn’t mean ‘can in practice’; it means something more like ‘can, setting aside all contingent cognitive shortcomings’. For Chalmers, a sentence S might be a priori for a subject s even if s is afflicted by cognitive limitations which make it impossible in practice for s to know S. For example, a sentence S might be a priori for a subject s because there exists an infinitely long proof of S — a proof which, being mortal, s could never survey.

Notice that Chalmers does not insist that all a priori sentences are knowable with certainty. When a subject s can know with certainty a sentence S with justification independent of experience, S is ‘conclusively a priori’ for s, in Chalmers’ terminology (p. 468).

2. Chalmers' rationalism

Some epistemologists have been of the opinion that there are no a priori truths. Chalmers’ case against this position is based on what he calls ‘the Frontloading Principle’:

If one knows M with justification from E . . . then one can know ˹If E then M˺ with justification independent of E. (Paraphrased from p. 162)

Given this premise, there’s an easy argument to the conclusion that there are a priori truths — indeed to the conclusion that there are synthetic a priori truths. Consider Aurel, whose total empirical evidence is expressed by the massively conjunctive sentence E0. Aurel knows the sentence M0, ‘There is an opera house in Sydney’, but only on the basis of indirect evidence: testimony, maps, pictures and so on. He’s never been to Australia. Now:

(1) Aurel knows M0 with justification from E0.

By the Frontloading Principle, one can immediately infer:

(2) Aurel can know ˹If E0 then M0˺, with justification independent of E0.

But since E0 expresses all of Aurel’s empirical evidence, if Aurel knows something with justification independent of E0, he knows it a priori, hence:

(3) Aurel can know a priori that ˹If E0 then M0˺.

Now ˹If E0 them M0˺ is not presumably not analytic.2 Aurel cannot rule out on purely conceptual grounds the hypothesis that there is no opera house in Sydney, and that he has evidence to the contrary only because he is the victim of a highly elaborate practical joke. We conclude that, pace some empiricists, there are synthetic a priori truths.3

But why should we accept the Frontloading Principle? Chalmers defends the principle in two ways. First:

One can argue . . . as follows. Given that E justifies M, then one could in principle (i) suspend judgment concerning E, (ii) suppose (for the purposes of conditional reasoning) that E, (iii) conclude (under this supposition) that M, with justification provided by E’s support for M, and (iv) discharge the supposition, yielding a justified conditional belief in M given E. This conditional belief is justified even though one has suspended judgment concerning E, so that E played no non-suppositional role in its support. So the conditional belief in M given E is justified independently of E. (pp. 162-63)

This is a powerful argument. Perhaps critics will reply that there are knowledge-producing methods of reasoning that are for some reason disallowed in suppositional reasoning. Or perhaps it will be argued that it is not always possible to ‘suspend judgment concerning E’. Remember that E0 is a massively conjunctive sentence that expresses all of Aurel’s empirical evidence; is it really possible for Aurel to suspend judgment concerning E0?

Second, Chalmers defends the principle by saying that ‘something like’ the principle is ‘at the foundation of the Bayesian principle of conditionalization’ (p. 163). I think that Chalmers is probably correct in this last claim; however, Chalmers’ opponents may respond that there are non-standard theories in formal epistemology that do not support the principleI am thinking here of the theory that Brian Weatherson calls the ‘dynamic Keynesian model’ (Weatherson 2007).

As we’ve seen, Chalmers’ principle commits him to the view that there are synthetic a priori truths. Chalmers also suspects that there are synthetic a priori truths in mathematics and ethics (p. 386). This puts Chalmers at odds with his hero, Carnap.  This book, Chalmers says,

picks up only on certain strands in Carnap, and not on his project as a whole. To oversimplify, one might say that where Carnap leans toward empiricism, I lean toward rationalism. (p. xviii)

Nevertheless, Chalmers does think that the apriority of some truths is to be by appeal to what he calls ‘warrant-analyticity’. Chalmers devotes two excurses (seventeen and nineteen) to developing this idea. To use his favourite example, Chalmers suspects that ‘All vixens are female foxes’ is a priori, and that it is a priori because it is warrant-analytic.

Let’s take a look at Chalmers’ term ‘warrant-analytic’. He begins with the suggestion that each word is ‘associated with’ an inferential role, which is ‘constituted by’ a number of inference patterns involving the word (p. 464). For example, the word ‘vixen’ might be associated with an inferential role constituted by these inference patterns:

x is a vixen.                                                      x is female and x is a fox.

            x is a female and x is a fox.                              x is a vixen.

Let’s use the term ‘core inference’ for tokens of inference patterns like this — i.e., inference patterns that are partly constitutive of the inferential role of some word. A sentence may then be said to be ‘warrant-analytic’ if it can be demonstrated using only core inferences. For example, the sentence ‘Vixens are female foxes’ might be warrant-analytic, because it might be possible to demonstrate this sentence using only core inferences (pp. 464-65).

For Chalmers, the word ‘vixen’ is something of an outlier in having an inferential role that can be compactly described. According to Chalmers, decades of discussion of the word ‘know’ leave little doubt that the inferential role of ‘know’ has no compact summary — and Chalmers thinks that most English words are like ‘know’ in this respect (pg. 11). But Chalmers maintains that ‘know’ has some inferential role — there are ‘core inferences’ associated with the word ‘know’ — it’s just that these core inferences cannot be compactly described (excursus 19, pp. 7-8).

So far, so good — but more detail is needed. In particular, more needs to be said about what it means to say that such-and-such inferential role is ‘associated’ with such-and-such word. To put it another way, some account is needed of how core inferences are differentiated from non-core inferences. One proposal that Chalmers considers (p.465) is derived from Boghossian (2003). I paraphrase:

The inferential role associated with a word w is constituted by those inference patterns that someone must be disposed to accept in order to count as fully understanding w.

But Timothy Williamson (2007, ch. 4) has argued at length that (for example) one can use and fully understand the word ‘vixen’ without being disposed to accept the inferences specified above. Chalmers accepts this criticism of Boghossian’s position (p. 464; excursus 19, p. 9), but as far as I can tell he offers no alternative to Boghossian’s proposal. So Chalmers’ theory of analyticity is incomplete as it stands.

 3. Chalmers on a priori scrutability

Chalmers defines the term ‘a priori scrutability base’ as follows:

An a priori scrutability base (for subject s) is set Γ of (true) sentences such that for any individual true sentence S, ˹If Γ& then S˺ is a priori for s. (pp. 58-60)

In this definition, I use a notational convention according to which for any set of sentences Γ, Γ& is the — possibly infinitary — conjunction of all the sentences in the set. A ‘compact’ scrutability base is (to put it briefly) a scrutability base that isn’t too large (pp. 20-21).

Chalmers’ strategy is as follows. In the beginning of chapter three, he describes a certain set of truths, which he calls ‘PQTI’. He then spends chapters 3, 4 and 6 arguing that PQTI is an a priori scrutability base. In chapter 7, he (rather more tentatively) tries to find smaller a priori scrutability bases by removing redundancies from PQTI.

PQTI is the union of the sets P, Q, T and I, where (paraphrasing):

P is the set of truths of fundamental physics, together with truths about the physical properties (size, shape, velocity etc.) of macrophysical objects. The set also contains some true counterfactual sentences. (p. 110)

Q is the set of phenomenal truths — truths about ‘what it is like to be a given entity’. Again, the set also contains some true counterfactual sentences. (p. 110)

I contains some indexical truths, which specify the location of the subject both spatially and temporally. (p. 111)

T contains just one sentence, a ‘totality sentence’ which asserts that nothing has been omitted from P, Q and I. (Pg. 111) It’s tricky to make this precise; Chalmers discusses the issue in his sixth excursus.

Here is a ‘postage stamp’ version of Chalmers’ defence of the claim that PQTI is an a priori scrutability base. We begin by defending:

(1) For any true sentence S, s can know ˹If PQTI&, then S˺.

As in the definition of ‘a priori’, the ‘can’ here does not mean ‘can in practice’, it means something like ‘can, ignoring s’s contingent cognitive limitations’. Chalmers defends (1) in a piecemeal fashion. He initially defends only the weaker thesis:

(1-) For any ordinary true sentence S, s can know ˹If PQTI&, then S˺.

The category of ‘ordinary’ truths ‘excludes hard cases such as mathematical, mental, metaphysical, modal, and moral truths’ (pg. 112-13). To defend (1-), Chalmers uses a charming thought experiment. Chalmers’ ‘cosmoscope’ is an imaginary device that presents all of the information in PQTI in a usable way — you could think of it a science-fiction version of Google Maps:

A Cosmoscope is a device that stores all the information in [PQTI] and makes it usable. In particular it contains (i) a supercomputer to store the information and to perform any necessary calculations; (ii) tools that use P to zoom in on arbitrary regions of the world, and to deliver information about the distribution of matter in those regions [perhaps using a three-dimensional holographic display]; (iii) a virtual reality device to produce direct knowledge of any phenomenal states described in Q; (iv) a ‘you are here’ marker to convey the information in I; and (v) simulation devices that deliver information about counterfactuals, exhibiting the physical and phenomenal states that will be produced under various counterfactual circumstances specified in [PQTI]. (p. 114)

Chalmers points out that ‘[a] reasonably intelligent subject could use a Cosmoscope to answer many questions: who was Jack the Ripper, will there be a Third World War, is there life on other planets?’ (p. 118). Indeed, Chalmers argues at length that for any ‘ordinary’ truth S, one could establish S using a Cosmoscope. But all the Cosmoscope does is present the information in PQTI in a usable form. So it follows, according to Chalmers, that ˹If PQTI&, then S˺ is knowable for any ordinary truth S. Hence:

(1-) For any ordinary true sentence S, s can know ˹If PQTI&, then S˺.

Chalmers deals with the various ‘extraordinary’ truths in a piecemeal fashion. There’s a section on mathematical truths, a section on ‘Fitchean’ truths, a section on moral truths, and so on. Having addressed these various classes of extraordinary truths, Chalmers is in a position to endorse:

(1) For any true sentence S, s can know ˹If PQTI&, then S˺.

Now nothing we’ve said so far indicates that the conditionals ˹If PQTI&, then S˺ are knowable a priori. It may be, for all we’ve said, that s would have to draw upon his pre-existing empirical knowledge to establish these conditionals. Let’s make this explicit. Let E be a conjunction that expresses all of s’s empirical evidence. Then:

(2) For any true sentence S, s can know ˹If PQTI&, then S˺ on the basis of E.

Then by (a slightly elaborated version of) the Frontloading Principle from the last section, we infer:

(3) For any true sentence S, s can know ˹If EPQTI&, then S˺, with justification independent of E.

But since E expresses all of s’s empirical knowledge, if s knows something with justification independent of E, he knows it a priori, hence:

(4) For any true sentence S, s can know ˹If EPQTI&, then S˺ a priori.

Now Chalmers argues (pp. 125-134) that all of the information captured by E could be obtained using a Cosmoscope, and so all of this information is already a priori implied by PQTI&. It follows that E is redundant in the antecedent of the conditional ˹If EPQTI&, then S˺, hence:

(5) For any true sentence S, s can know ˹If PQTI&, then S˺ a priori.

That is, PQTI is an a priori scrutability base — which is the desired conclusion.

Having defended the claim that PQTI is an a priori scrutability base, Chalmers goes on to address a large number of other ‘scrutability theses’. Metaphysicians will be particularly interested by Chalmers’ defence of the claim that the set of metaphysically fundamental truths is an a priori scrutability base (p. 404-09). If correct, this thesis is an important constraint in the theory of grounding: as Chalmers argues, it seems to rule out certain forms of physicalism (p. 409).

4. Chalmers’ Fregean theory of sense

Chalmers finds many applications for his ‘scrutability theses’, but I don’t have space to discuss more than one. In this section, I look at his work on the foundations of semantics — work which he promises to extend ‘in a forthcoming companion volume, The Multiplicity of Meaning’ (p. xxi).

Chalmers is sympathetic to Frege’s theory of sense; however, he accepts that (pending further work) the notion of sense is ‘obscure’ (p. 250). So Chalmers sets himself the task of giving a detailed Fregean theory of sense. (Here, the term ‘Fregean’ is used rather broadly — see Stanley (forthcoming)). The basic idea is to modify orthodox possible world semantics by using epistemically possible cases instead of metaphysically possible worlds. Since the notion of an ‘epistemically possible case’ is arguably almost as obscure as the notion of Fregean sense, Chalmers gives a detailed account of what epistemically possible cases are, drawing upon his scrutability theses.

But let’s start at the beginning. The idea is that ‘Fregean’ senses are to be identified with ‘intensions’:

[I] simply define an intension as a function from possible cases to extensions. For a [common noun] like ‘Pferd’, the intension will be a function from possible cases to objects characterized in those cases. For a sentence such as ‘Grass is green’, the intension will be a function from possible cases to truth-values. (p. 204)

Chalmers finds attractive an operational definition of intension suggested in Carnap (1955):

Carnap’s key idea is that we can investigate the intension that a subject associated with an expression by investigating the subject’s judgments about possible cases. To determine the intension of an expression such as ‘Pferd’ for a subject, we present the subject with descriptions of various logically possible cases, and we ask the subject whether he or she is willing to apply the term ‘Pferd’ to objects specified in these cases. If we do this for enough cases, then we can test all sorts of hypotheses about the intension of the expression. . . . Of course one cannot actually present a subject with all possible cases to determine every aspect of an intension. But Carnap suggests that the intension that a speaker associates with an expression is determined by the speaker’s linguistic dispositions. For a given expression E used by a given speaker, the speaker will have the disposition to associate a given extension with E, when presented with a possible case. For example, given a sentence S, the speaker will have the disposition to judge the sentence as true or false of a possible case, when presented with that case. The intension of an expression can then be seen as a function that maps possible cases to the extension that the speaker is disposed to identify, when presented with that case. In this way, Carnap defines an expression’s intension in naturalistic and even operational terms. (pp. 204-05)

Now as Chalmers notes, there are several obvious problems with this proposal as it stands; I’ll discuss two of them.

First, Carnap’s operational definition of ‘intension’ will fail when applied to speakers disposed to make mistakes. For example, the intension of the sentence ‘87,467+12,883=100,530’ is a function which maps every possible case to the true — but many speakers of English would not always answer ’That’s true!’ when given a possible case and asked to assess the truth value of the sentence relative to the case. In order to deal with this problem, Chalmers suggests the intension of a word (for a given speaker at a given time) is determined not by how the speaker is in fact disposed to respond to Carnapian interrogation, but by how she should respond. (Thus, Chalmers’ account of intension does not constitute an operational definition.)

Second, the proposal is incomplete without some account of what these ‘possible cases’ are and how they are to be ‘presented’ to a speaker. I’ll illustrate this second problem with an example. Consider:

(a) There is a field containing three woodchucks: Alfred, Beth and Charlie.

(b) There is a field containing three groundhogs: Alfred, Beth and Charlie.

We can suppose that our speaker believes that groundhogs and woodchucks are of distinct species. We can even suppose that our speaker is rational in believing this, having received a lot of misleading zoological evidence. Now it’s tempting to say that (a) and (b) are descriptions of the very same possible case. Let’s call it ‘c’. Let f be the intension of ‘woodchuck’, as this term is used by our speaker. If we present our speaker with case c using description (a), she will quite rationally say that Alfred, Beth and Charlie are woodchucks. This suggests:

f(c) = {Alfred, Beth, Charlie}

However, if we present our speaker with case c under description (b), she will quite rationally say that no groundhogs have been described. This suggests:

f(c) = Ø

Something has gone wrong. What we need is some account of what ‘possible cases’ are, and we need some canonical way of presenting them to speakers. To deal with this second issue, Chalmers draws upon his work on scrutability.

First, Chalmers constructs his ‘possible cases’ — what are normally called ‘epistemically possible worlds’. To do this, he stipulates that a sentence is ‘e-possible’ if its negation is not conclusively a priori (p. 235). He then says that a sentence G is epistemically complete if there is no H such that both G&H and G&~H are e-possible (p. 235). Two sentences G1 and G2 are ‘equivalent’ when both G1G2 and G2G1 are conclusively a priori (p. 235). Then Chalmers identifies his ‘possible cases’ with equivalence classes of complete sentences (p. 236). A ‘(complete) description’ of a possible case is then just an element of it.

Now we’d like some privileged vocabulary in which to give canonical complete descriptions of these possible cases. Ideally, this privileged vocabulary will be reasonably compact, but it will nevertheless be possible to give a complete description of each possible case using only the privileged vocabulary. Now it is by no means obvious that a vocabulary of this kind exists. In arguing that PQTI is an a priori scrutability base, Chalmers has arguably established that the actual case has a compact description, but it doesn’t follow that there is some compact vocabulary which can be used to describe every possible case. That there is such a vocabulary is one version of what Chalmers calls the ‘generalized scrutability thesis’. He defends this claim in the final chapter of the book (pp. 409-23).

One of Chalmers’ targets in his discussion of sense is Quine, who famously rejected the idea that there are such objects as ‘meanings’ or ‘senses’ (Quine 1960, ch. VI).4 Chalmers also devotes a chapter (chapter five) to dealing with one of Quine’s arguments (Quine 1951) for the claim that there are no a priori truths.


I said at the beginning of this review that Chalmers’ book is monumental in its length and its extraordinary scope. I think it’s a safe bet that it will also be monumental in its influence. Chalmers’ book is sure to dominate future discussions of apriority and Fregean sense — and with good reason: it is fascinating, well-argued and highly original. If you’ll excuse a reviewers’ cliché, Constructing the World is required reading for philosophers interested in epistemology or the foundations of semantics.



I would like to thank David Chalmers for his comments on an early draft of this review.


The additional material for Chalmers’ book, together with the first chapter of the book and the first two excursuses.

Recordings of Chalmers’ John Locke lectures


Carnap, Rudolph. 1928. Der logische Aufbau der Welt. Berlin: Weltkreis.

Carnap, Rudolph. 1955. ‘Meaning and Synonymy in Natural Languages’. Philosophical Studies 6(3): 33-47.

Hawthorne, John. 2002. ‘Deeply Contingent A Priori Knowledge’. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 65: 247-269.

Quine, Willard van Orman. 1951. ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’. The Philosophical Review 60: 20-43.

Quine, Willard van Orman. 1960. Word and Object. Cambridge: The MIT Press.

Quine, Willard van Orman. 1992. The Pursuit of Truth. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Stanley, Jason. Forthcoming. ‘Constructing Meanings’. Analysis.

Weatherson, Brian. 2007. ‘The Bayesian and the Dogmatist’. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 107(1): 169-185.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Williamson, Timothy. 2007. The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.


1 In the introduction (pp. xvi – xvii), Chalmers gives the following list of applications:

Applications to epistemology, the study of knowledge, are perhaps the most obvious. For example, the scrutability thesis is at least a cousin of the knowability thesis, the thesis that all truths can be known. In addition, I will argue later that a version of the scrutability thesis can help with the problem of skepticism about the external world.

There are also applications in many other areas. In metaphysics, specific versions of the scrutability thesis can be used to help determine what is true and what is fundamental. In the philosophy of science, the scrutability thesis can be used to shed light on reductive explanation and the unity of science. In the philosophy of mind, the scrutability thesis can be used to help understand primitive concepts and the content of thought. And perhaps most importantly, the thesis has powerful applications in the philosophy of language, helping us to analyze notions of meaning and content that are tied to thought and knowledge.

In fact, the scrutability framework bears directly on many of the central debates in philosophy. One version of the thesis can be used to defend a Fregean approach to meaning (an analysis of meaning grounded in rationality and the a priori) over a purely Russellian approach (an analysis grounded in reference and the external world). Another can be used to defend internalism about mental content, defining a sort of content that is largely intrinsic to the subject, against a strong externalism on which all content depends on the environment. Another can be used as a key premise in an argument against materialism about consciousness. Another can be used to deflate many traditional skeptical arguments about knowledge. Another can be used to support a version of structural realism about science.

2 Proponents of Timothy Williamson’s ‘E=K’ thesis will disagree (Williamson 2000). Proponents of this position may use a variant on the above argument which starts with this slightly modified version of the Frontloading Principle:

If one is in a position to know M on the basis of evidence E . . . then one is in a position to know ˹If E then M˺ with justification independent of E.

Now suppose that Aurel has never formed an opinion on the question of whether M0 is true, but that (were he to consider the matter) he could easily establish M0 on the basis of his existing evidence (i.e., his existing knowledge.) The argument is then straightforward.

3 In much the same way, one can use the Frontloading Principle to defend the claim that there are a priori truths that are ‘deeply contingent’ in the sense of Hawthorne 2002 — though this is not a point that Chalmers dwells upon.

4 One suspects that Quine would reject Chalmers’ theory of sense on the grounds that it makes illicit appeal to normative notions: Quine sought a behaviouristic theory of language (Quine 1992: 37-38). However, few philosophers today think that Quine’s behaviouristic strictures are well-motivated.