Constructive Empiricism. Epistemology and the Philosophy of Science

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Paul Dicken, Constructive Empiricism. Epistemology and the Philosophy of Science, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 237pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230247536.

Reviewed by F. A. Muller, Erasmus University Rotterdam


In 1980, Bas C. van Fraassen's Constructive Empiricism (CE) challenged the reign and rule of realism: the baby of empiricism was being thrown out with the logical-positivist bath water. Empiricism was (and still is) alive and kicking, and this novel, 'constructive' version made the case. Ever since, CE has been unfolding as a more general philosophical view of sizzling subtlety and rigorous refinement, frequently in response to a steady stream of criticism, and virtually single-handedly by its creator. Although there are a number of edited volumes of essays devoted to CE, Dicken's is (to the best of my knowledge) the first monograph on the topic. The monograph seems an outgrowth of Dicken's PhD thesis, written under the supervision of the late Peter Lipton of Cambridge University. As the subtitle indicates, van Fraassen's general epistemic view, known as Epistemic Voluntarism (EpV), is Dicken's main subject of analysis and criticism.

Chapter 1 is an introductory exposition of CE and EpV, that prepares the ground for the subsequent chapters. In Chapter 2, Dicken elaborately analyzes EpV, and in Chapter 3 he rehearses a few arguments against EpV. In Chapter 4, he announces a different epistemic view that, however, heavily relies on van Fraassen's distinction between acceptance and belief and on L.J. Cohen's An Essay on Belief and Acceptance, while doing everything within his power not to direct attention to that monograph. These last three chapters, each of about equal length (around 60 pages), form the body of the book, which ends with a four page summary. Well-informed philosophers of science can limit themselves to reading Chapter 4, which is the only place where something new sees the light of day.

The monograph is an easily readable and thorough inquiry into EpV and its relation to CE; at times it is repetitive and discursive. I will begin by pointing out a number of flaws including: a misleading comparison (of observability to a gold sphere of a diameter larger than 10 miles, p. 97) and an inconsistent concept ("unobservable phenomena'', passim). There are also a lot of wrong ascriptions, e.g., that van Fraassen allegedly claims that "beliefs about unobservable phenomena are somehow reducible to (exhaustive) beliefs about observable phenomena'', (p. 94), although he never has claimed this; Dicken’s claim that he was the one to characterise belief as involuntary and acceptance as voluntary (e.g., p. 166) when Cohen claimed this about 20 years earlier in the above mentioned monograph.

From its inception, CE included an epistemic -- or more accurately a doxastic -- policy about science: believe only those propositions from what is generally accepted by science that are about observables only; about the other generally accepted propositions one should pass over in silence or assume a neutral doxastic attitude (neither believe nor disbelieve them, but do acknowledge their possible truth and possible falsehood). Or in the more accurate terms of CE: believe the empirical adequacy of accepted scientific theories, rather than their truth (or ontological adequacy). The criterion of empirical adequacy of theories is couched in terms of the embeddability of data structures representing the relevant phenomena in past, present and future and the mathematical structures through which one defines theories. What is propositional scientific knowledge according to CE? Although an answer to this question is not in van Fraassen's writings, a rough and ready answer can be put forward: all and only the generally accepted propositions of science that are about observables entirely constitute propositional scientific knowledge. It follows that there is no such thing as scientific knowledge of, say, dark energy, radioactive radiation, subatomic particles and black holes, because those are not observables. Enter the realism debate. van Fraassen also holds that it is not irrational to break with his doxastic policy. The realist who believes in the existence of dark energy, radioactive radiation, subatomic particles and black holes is rational too, according to CE.

Precisely here we are leaving the realism debate in the philosophy of science for we are now facing general questions of doxastic rationality. What is rational to believe? Which doxastic policies are rational? Is there anything that a rational person is forbidden to believe? Is there anything that a rational person is compelled to believe? Is it irrational not to adopt a rule-based doxastic policy? Van Fraassen's EpV is constructed to answer precisely these sorts of questions.

EpV is an extremely permissive view on doxastic rationality: for subject S it is rational to believe that p iff S does not sabotage its own ends by believing p. Since probability theory provides a framework for 'the logic of judgment', one way of fleshing out what it means for S 'to sabotage his own ends' is to close a Dutch book, granted that an end of S is not to lose money when making a bet. So via Dutch book arguments, does EpV collapse to Bayesian doxastology (epistemology)? Not exactly, because Dutch book arguments assume that S uses a rule to change his beliefs when S acquires new evidence. According to EpV, it is perfectly rational not to follow a rule when changing one's beliefs, perhaps in some ad hoc manner, some heavily context-dependent manner or some dogmatic manner. One also need not even engage in quantitative belief-dynamics in order to judge beliefs to be rational or irrational: it is not irrational to hop about only in qualitative doxastology (epistemology). Such is the permissive character of EpV. One can believe just about anything and remain rational, provided that one's beliefs do not sabotage one's own ends. Thus, what separates EpV from doxastic anarchism, i.e., no doxastic policy (believe whatever you want), is no more than logical consistency and (synchronic and diachronic) probabilistic coherence, which thus seem the only doxastic norms to live by when one wants to live a rational doxastic life.

One complaint of Dicken's is that EpV fails to provide a substantive epistemic view on the basis of which one can deal with the epistemic issues of confirmation and disconfirmation in science. Any philosophical view of science that does not make sense of confirmation and disconfirmation a fortiori does not make sense of science, whereas the aim of CE is to make sense of science. One question that jumps to mind is why EpV & CE cannot appeal to Bayesian confirmation theory to make sense of confirmation and disconfirmation in science. Dicken does not tell us the answer. Another complaint is that there are no convincing arguments in favour of EpV. For instance, criticism of ampliative methods of inference is not an argument in favour of EpV. Van Fraassen's well-known criticisms of ampliative inferences are intended to establish that such inferences are not compelling, not that those who employ them are irrational. Well, if all ampliative inference methods are not compelling but are rational, then we are definitely moving into the direction of EpV. Dicken's defences of ampliative inference methods do not establish that we are compelled to rely on ampliative inferences in our doxastic policies; they illustrate their rationality. At the end of Chapter 2 (p. 68), in which the complaints mentioned in the current paragraph are levelled, Dicken admits that EpV is still up and running, with at most a few scratches. So far Dicken has fired blanks; but in Chapter 3, he is aiming for the kill-shot.

The first shot is Musgrave's problem: CE cannot believe that electrons are unobservable because that is saying something about an unobservable and thus the doxastic policy of CE prescribes that CE should not believe this. Van Fraassen responded with an argument to the effect that he can believe that actual electrons are unobservable. But then it turned out that Musgrave's problem can be extended: CE cannot believe that possible electrons are unobservable, which runs counter to the way CE draws the distinction between observables and unobservables: as orthogonal to existing and not-existing. Van Fraassen (and this reviewerr) responded by amending the doxastic policy by prescribing to believe that Fs are unobservable if some accepted theory says so and then limiting the doxastic policy to accepted propositions that do not include 'Fs are unobservable' or any of its logical combinations. Strangely, Dicken does not accept this proposal. Instead, he says that since CE needs to believe certain modal propositions (the unobservability of possible electrons; if an electron were in front of me in broad daylight, then I would not see it), and for that an account of modality is needed. True. Van Fraassen and Bradley Monton sketched an account, as did this reviewer, on the basis of the structural view of scientific theories. Dicken's final shot is that to get such accounts off the ground, belief in abstract mathematical entities is needed (e.g., models and structures), which violates CE's doxastic policy because abstract entities are unobservable. One obvious response is that CE only needs to accept those entities, rather than to believe in their actual existence. Thus the conclusion of Chapter 3 is not that CE and EpV are bleeding to death due to Dicken’s kill-shots, but that Dicken has shot himself a few times in the foot.

In the next and final Chapter 4, Dicken argues that with the distinction between acceptance and belief in position, CE & EpV can be resurrected. If one ignores the distinction between acceptance and belief, then CE is in trouble (Chapter 3), and if one does not ignore the distinction, then CE is fine (Chapter 4). Since the distinction has been part and parcel of CE since its birth, Chapter 3 displays a wrong-headed spectacle, and as a consequence Chapter 4 runs the danger of displaying a redundant spectacle. Whether the danger is avoided, Dicken does get the bullets out of his foot -- so he is alive and kicking too, just as empiricism is. More important is that Dicken succeeds in avoiding the potential danger: his elaboration of the distinction between belief and acceptance is wholly on target, and his arguments that every philosophical view on science must take this distinction aboard, ranging from the varieties of realism to the subjects of idealisation and contradiction in science, I found equally on target and promising. Thus Chapter 4 is recommended reading for philosophers of science.