Constructivism in Ethics

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Carla Bagnoli (ed.), Constructivism in Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 258pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9781107650329.

Reviewed by Yonatan Shemmer, University of Sheffield


This is a selection of excellent papers, some of which deal with exegetical issues in the work of Kant, Rawls, Scanlon and Korsgaard, and others with foundational questions about the constructivist program. Carla Bagnoli offers a wide-ranging introduction that describes the history of constructivism, identifies some of its central problems and links these to the essays that follow. I recommend this collection both to researchers who work in metaethics and to graduate students who wish to gain a better understanding of the issues surrounding constructivism.

I offer a summary of each of the papers and a short discussion of David Copp’s. His paper is part of a growing literature whose aim is to show that constructivism is not an independent metaethical position. Indeed many of the other papers in this collection bear in different ways on the same question. I hope that by focusing on his view I will be able to highlight the ways in which constructivism is primarily a formulation of a new metaethical question and only secondarily an attempt to provide a solution to that question.

I present first papers that are, roughly speaking, supportive of constructivism.

Oliver Sensen sets out to determine whether Kant is a constructivist or a moral realist. Sensen’s starting point is the thought that Kant need not be strictly committed to one view or the other since the question can be asked about (a) his view about moral value, or (b) his view about the content of the moral law, or (c) his view about the bindingness of the moral law, or (d) his view about the morality of this or that action. With respect to (a), Sensen claims that Kant is certainly not a realist and in any case that value plays only a secondary role in his writings. With respect to (b) and (c), he argues that Kant is neither a realist nor a subjectivist constructivist. Rather, according to Sensen, when it comes to the moral law Kant is a constitutivist who thinks that such law is necessary and given a priori but only as a result of the application of our reasoning activity. Finally with respect to (d), Kant is a constructivist who thinks that what is right is determined by those inclinations and needs that are consistent with duty.

Stephen Engstrom argues that constructivism’s unique contribution to moral philosophy lies in its solution to the old debate between Humeans and cognitivists about the nature of moral judgments. Cognitivists emphasize the passive nature of these judgments, their being a kind of perception of objective independent truths. Humeans emphasize the efficacy of moral judgments, the fact that they can bring about action. These two features have seemed to many to be in tension because they have assumed that reason is solely a theoretical capacity to acquire knowledge of things that exist independently of that knowledge. Constructivism’s most important contribution to moral philosophy is its rehabilitation of a different understanding of reason, an understanding that sees reason as having a practical as well as a theoretical use. In its practical use reason gives rise to practical knowledge, knowledge that is both active and passive: “In knowing that I should ϕ, I understand that it is through this very knowledge that I am to ϕ. Such knowledge accordingly conceives what it represents as its own effect, its own action, something depending on it for its realization” (p. 145).

Bagnoli defends Kantian constructivsm from the claim that it does not represent a distinct metaethical position, either because it is neutral between various metaethical positions or because it is at bottom a realist position. Those who make this accusation interpret the constructivist appeal to a procedure of construction as an attempt to give an alternative ontological account of the normative domain. Naturally such understanding leads one to wonder how constructivists could escape the standard metaethical distinctions. Bagnoli then argues that constructivists can evade this criticism by construing the procedure of construction as a special form of knowledge: practical knowledge. Practical knowledge, says Bagnoli, should be understood as a knowledge not of independent objective ends but rather as knowledge of one’s own will and its limitations.

I now move to present papers that are, roughly speaking, critical of the constructivist project, ending with two papers that raise the worry of the distinctness of constructivism as a metaethical position.

Robert Stern argues that a careful reading of the formula of humanity argument in section two of the Groundwork will support not a constructivist but rather a realist interpretation of the Kantian project. Stern’s reading takes as a background assumption the view that Kant was not concerned with refuting skepticism. On the contrary Kant took for granted our ordinary conception of morality according to which there is a categorical imperative that serves as the supreme principle of morality. Against the background of this assumption Stern claims that the most plausible interpretation of the formula of humanity argument is that taking rational agents as ultimate ends is the best way to explain the categoricity of moral imperatives. It is the best way because only these ends have the kind of absolute value that could ground the universal and necessary nature of these imperatives.

William FitzPatrick criticizes Korsgaard’s attempt to derive Kant’s categorical imperative from considerations of what is constitutive of agency. FitzPatrick doubts that an appeal to action or agency alone can show that any principle is strictly necessary for us. But more importantly he argues that even if we could show that such necessity obtains, it would at most give us the necessity of seeing our reasons as general in the sense of thinking that we must obey the same reasons in the future and that others must obey them, too. However this kind of generality requirement falls short of the specifically moral content of Kant’s categorical imperative, since it is possible to satisfy it by following, for example, the maxim of always behaving egoistically and thinking that others have reasons to do so as well.

Mark LeBar argues that constructivism’s emphasis on the distinction between the deliberative and critical point of view should make constructivists more sympathetic than they are to particularism. That distinction, says LeBar, involves an implicit recognition of the lesson of Carroll’s fable about Achilles and the tortoise. The lesson is that reasoning will always include an application in judgments of rules that cannot depend for their execution on a theoretical recognition of their validity. But, claims LeBar, if one acknowledges this lesson, as constructivist do, and if one further acknowledges that the application of any practical principle to a particular case must depend on the judgment that no special circumstances have arisen that will make the principle irrelevant, as they should, then one will perforce also admit that a theory of general principles cannot exhaust the constructivist project. Rather the constructivist project must include, if not give pride of place to, a theory of the ways in which judgments are used to determine whether normative judgments apply in particular cases.

Thomas Baldwin analyses the constructivist programs of Rawls and Scanlon and concludes that both suffer from a similar shortcoming. In both a rationalist procedure is advanced for determining moral principles, and in both cases such a procedure cannot yield determinate conclusions without some basic moral presuppositions. Furthermore, for both, the moral presuppositions in question are of the type that was supposed to be yielded by the procedure; and, since they are presupposed, they cannot be grounded by the procedure. While this is no proof that all constructivist projects in ethics are bound to face the same problem, Baldwin thinks his diagnosis should prompt us to prefer a different interpretation of constructivism. On this interpretation we must distinguish, à la Kuhn, between normal morality and morality in crisis. Normal morality is the output of historical evolving practices. At times of crisis such morality comes into question and then must be reorganized and codified. Constructivism does not play a role during the constitution of morality by social practices. It comes into its own as a tool for adequately assessing complaints about the practice at times of crisis. Most importantly the codification that results from the application of the constructivist procedure is never the last word -- practices will always evolve to address new questions and new social facts.

Henry Richardson poses a dilemma for pragmatists (and, I take it, according to Richardson, constructivism is at heart a pragmatist view). If they prescribe rigid norms of moral inquiry, they will be incapable of accommodating moral disagreement and will fall short of the pragmatist guiding thought according to which our best norms are those we would have at the end of a well-informed inquiry. If on the other hand they leave the standards of inquiry only very abstractly sketched, they open themselves to the possibility that norms of moral inquiry, and as a result moral norms themselves, would branch if inquiry were to take different paths.

Nadeem Hussain and Nishi Shah argue that, contrary to Korsgaard’s claim, her version of constructivism fails to go ‘beyond’ metaethics. To support this conclusion they first argue against Korsgaard’s view that there isn’t a clear divide between normative ethics and metaethics. On the contrary, according to them, you can take a normative stance without thereby being committed to any particular metaethical position. They then argue that Korsgaard’s theory of instrumental reason in particular and more generally her claim that certain norms are constitutive of agency are claims in normative ethics and therefore are compatible with a range of metaethical views. In a twin paper they have emphasized the compatibility of her view with realism, whereas in this paper they emphasize the compatibility of her view with non-cognitivism. They thus conclude that Korsgaard’s position is neither a new metaethical position nor a way of showing that we should replace the questions of traditional metaethics with more pertinent questions.

Copp argues that constructivist views are forms of moral naturalism, by which he means mind dependent, non-error-theoretical realist positions, and therefore the debate about whether we should prefer constructivism to realism or vice versa is moot. On Copp’s understanding constructivists and other naturalists differ in two ways. Firstly, constructivists characterize the truth conditions of moral claims in terms of the output of certain hypothetical procedures of deliberation, whereas other naturalists do so in terms of non-procedural states of affairs. And secondly, constructivists claim that the outputs of the aforementioned procedures constitute the moral facts, or, in other words, that true moral claims are true because certain hypothetical procedures yield certain results, whereas other naturalists think that our moral claims are true because of facts that are independent of these procedures. However, says Copp, these two differences are unimportant. What is important is the debate between those who think that there are true moral claims and those who don’t, and the debate between those who think that normative facts are primitive facts and those who think that these facts can be explained in terms of other facts. On these two debates constructivists and other naturalists take the same side.

In the remainder of this review I want to take a closer look at Copp’s argument.

The differences between constructivism and other forms of moral naturalism are unimportant according to Copp because they do not locate the theories in question on different sides of any significant metaethical divide. The significant metaethical questions need not divide constructivists and other naturalists.  I suspect that Copp’s analysis does not capture what is most distinctive about constructivism. Let us assume for the sake of argument that Copp is right and that most constructivists are willing to adopt the ontological commitments of naturalist realism. Does this mean that there is nothing distinctive and of metaethical importance in the constructivist position?

To see what is distinctive and metaethically significant about the constructivist project we need to focus on the second difference, discussed by Copp, between constructivists and other naturalists. Constructivists argue that the truth of moral claims is constituted by the output of certain reasoning procedures, but contra Copp they also argue that this fact offers us some insight into the nature of moral truth that cannot be captured by non-constructivist views. Consider first how the relation between moral truths and our reasoning capacities is seen from a third person perspective. A moral truth must be able to affect our deliberative capacities since it’s essential to its normativity that it is capable of justifying. To deliberate is to reason practically. So as theorists we cannot be sure that we have correctly located moral truths unless we have a grasp of those deliberative capacities and the reasoning procedures that give us these capacities. This explains why a theoretical understanding of our deliberative capacities is necessary to identify moral truths, but it does not yet explain why moral truths must be constituted by the outputs of our reasoning procedures.

Then, says the constructivist, consider the position of a reasoning agent who herself is unsure what norms she should be guided by. Since such an agent is not yet sure which norms she should follow she must characterize them as those norms that her reasoning procedures will treat as reasons. Thus, from the deliberative perspective, says the constructivist, moral truths are constituted by the output of our reasoning procedures. Any attempt to give a non-procedural naturalist account of these norms cannot explain how an agent who is trying to find a justification for her actions can come to recognize that certain norms and not others are justified. Take, for example, the naturalist position according to which we should do whatever satisfies our needs. If you already judge that you should do what satisfies your needs, you are not in the deliberative position. You have already concluded the most important step in the process of deliberation. But as long as you are still deliberating you have no way of knowing whether doing what satisfies your needs is the right thing to do until you check whether you would reach this conclusion if you were to follow ideal procedures of reasoning. Thus, says the constructivist, these reasoning procedures are constitutive of what it is to be a moral truth.

Copp may agree that this is how things are seen from the first person perspective but argue that such a first person perspective does not affect our understanding of the ontology of moral facts, nor does it affect our claim that there are true answers to normative questions. He will thus claim that whatever the constructivist has to say about the first person point of view is of no metaethical significance. But this seems to me to be a mistake.

A constructivist might insist that there is a significant question about how we come to be justified in accepting normative claims and that whatever answers one supplies to Copp’s questions about ontology and truth do not answer this justificatory question.

But what does the constructivist mean when she speaks of ‘justification’? Is the so-called ‘justificatory’ question not just another name for the epistemic question in the practical domain?

Some theorists, though not Copp, have claimed that while constructivism does not offer us a new ontology or a new theory of meaning, it does offer us a distinct epistemic view. Constructivists, say these theorists, understand the process by which we come to know moral truths as procedural and thus as non-recognitional (James Lenman, Michael Ridge). It is this view, they claim, that affords constructivism a unique metaethical position. But while this is true as far as it goes, Copp may maintain that constructivists have no deep argument for this epistemic proceduralism. If moral facts are logically prior to our procedures of reasoning, then there is no principled reason for thinking that our only access to these facts could be provided by these procedures. So if Copp is right and constructivists share the naturalist’s ontology, and if constructivists maintain that their view differs from other naturalist views only in its epistemic commitments, they would be hard pressed to explain what is advantageous about these commitments.

However, as far as I understand, the constructivist does not think of the question of first person justification as a mere epistemic question (see also Engstrom and Bagnoli). Imagine again the position of a reasoning agent who is unsure which norms she should be guided by and is thus seeking a justification for her action. Such an agent is therefore also not in a position to select the proper account of moral epistemology since she cannot use any independent grasp of the moral facts as a way of justifying her preference for one epistemic account over another. For such an agent there is only one way to characterize moral truths: moral truths are those truths that she could justifiably adopt, or, in other words, those truths that pass the test of her reasoning procedures -- whatever these procedures may turn out to be.

If these considerations are correct, then what is most distinct about constructivism is the new metaethical question that it identifies. From the first person perspective, say constructivists, we face a justificatory task that is not a mere epistemic task. Given that task we are committed to the following constitutive thesis: normative claims are true, if they are true at all, because they are the outputs of our reasoning procedures.