Constructivism in Practical Philosophy

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James Lenman and Yonatan Shemmer (eds.), Constructivism in Practical Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 261pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199609833.

Reviewed by Ben Laurence, University of Chicago


Constructivism is by now a prominent position in the field of philosophical theorizing about the sources and nature of normativity, apparently jockeying with more entrenched meta-ethical rivals such as expressivism and realism. Taking inspiration from Rawls' pioneering Dewey Lectures, "Kantian Constructivism in Moral Philosophy", constructivists seek to account for the objectivity and authority of (some region of) normativity by showing it to arise from, or be "constructed" within, the practical point of view of the agent or community of agents. Often, although not always, this takes the form of specifying a procedure, a device of representation, through which normative principles may be derived from the relevant conception of the person or community of persons.

The twelve authors of this helpful anthology represent a wide variety of positions on constructivism, ranging from believers of various stripes to perplexed and outright skeptics. The essays presuppose familiarity with the burgeoning literature on constructivism, so the volume will best serve those doing research or offering graduate courses. I will focus on three broad topics that cut across several of the essays: (1) the contrast between constructivism and expressivism, (2) the proper scope or ambition of a constructivist theory, and (3) the contest between Humean and Kantian constructivisms.

Let us call a theory "realist" if it accounts for normativity by appeal to a fixed and independent order of normative facts or reasons. Constructivism shares with expressivism an opposition to realism so understood. Expressivists tend to be motivated in this opposition by a desire to make normativity safe for a naturalistic understanding of the world. They set out to explain how normatively-ladenlanguage and thought could come to exhibit the logical and semantic properties it does without appeal to an independent order of moral facts. Some constructivists, by contrast, are immune to such naturalistic anxieties. In any case, their primary opposition to realism arises from the thought that realism cannot explain the practical authority of norms, and their goal is to explain how a normative order can be binding on us. As is so often the case in philosophy, constructivism and expressivism, setting out from different questions, in pursuit of different aims, traverse what is pretty clearly the same terrain with apparently conflicting results. Given their different starting points and aims, the difficult question then arises how the resulting positions are related.

Several essays address this and related questions, including those by R.J. Wallace, Michael Ridge, James Lenman and Dale Dorsey. Wallace's essay provides a careful and charitable, although ultimately critical, reconstruction of the ambitious constructivism about all practical normativity found in the work of Christine Korsgaard. When it comes to locating the point of disagreement between constructivism and expressivism, Wallace points out that one might be tempted to say that constructivists countenance (constructed) normative facts as the truth-makers of normative judgments, whereas expressivists decline appeal to such facts in building up their semantic program. However, as he quickly notes, this won't do, since both expressivists and constructivists begin by eschewing an appeal to an order of self-standing normative facts, and both work towards an account of practical judgment as truth-assessable in virtue of the practical commitments of the agent. (Indeed, both are willing to countenance legitimate talk of normative facts, provided it is understood in a certain way.) Wallace's final verdict is that we should take the divergent aims and starting points of these positions at face value, and admit that they are compatible but not mutually entailing positions. If this is right, then a constructivist might happily adopt -- or reject -- an expressivist semantics for normative discourse, while sticking with her analysis of the objectivity and authority of normativity.

Dorsey's contribution fits with Wallace's picture of the relation between the views. Dorsey argues that when treated as though it were addressing semantic questions, constructivism quickly leads to a viciously circular account of the meaning of normative terms. He suggests that it should instead be construed as a theory of the metaphysics of normativity. Dorsey then indicates, drawing on newly emerging pluralist accounts of truth, how this metaphysics might be paired with a suitably cognitivist semantic theory. Lenman, again in apparent agreement with Wallace, argues that the most plausible development of constructivism will be compatible with the sort of expressivism that he favors. Ridge argues that depending on how a constructivist view is elaborated, it will turn out to be one distinctive species of a range of more familiar meta-ethical views belonging to either the cognitivist or non-cognitivist camp. Both Lenman and Ridge thus hold that the distinctiveness of constructivism as a meta-ethical position is lost in the translation of the arguments of constructivists into clearer idioms and more fully stated theories.

However, as many have noted, constructivism only even appears to be a distinctive meta-ethical position if it is given wide scope and ambition. Rawls' constructivism was narrow in scope, applying only to the domain of political justice. Furthermore, his account made ineliminable appeal to aspects of normativity lying outside of the targeted domain of construction, for example, to the reasons that the contractors would have for choosing various principles from behind the veil of ignorance. Similarly, T. M. Scanlon, in his constructivist account of the individual morality of right and wrong, appeals to the reasons agents have to reject the moral principles under consideration. This more local constructivism is intended only as a method for characterizing a delimited region of normativity in terms of a broader normative background. If one has a realist understanding of this normative background, then, meta-ethically speaking, the account produced will best be thought of as a roundabout realist one, with the same, presumably, holding for expressivism.

Scanlon's penetrating essay explains why he takes only the more limited approach. He begins with a comparison between the problems that give rise to the philosophy of mathematics and the parallel ones that issue in the need for moral philosophy. In light of these problems, he then discusses the rationale of constructivist approaches to mathematical truth that served as the original inspiration for constructivism about normativity. Arrived at by reflection on these materials, Scanlon's picture of constructivism in practical philosophy is strongly proceduralist: a view is only constructivist if it characterizes a domain in terms of a procedure, the steps of which can be applied to arrive at judgments in the targeted domain, without appealing to judgments within that domain. For, it is only if the application of the procedure is in this way independent from the substance of the target domain that one can coherently say that the truth of judgments of the target domain consists in their being the outcome of the relevant procedure.

Scanlon's reasons for rejecting a more ambitious constructivism that would construct the entire domain of all practical reasons are subtle, and I cannot do full justice to them here. In the end, his case rests on his claim that reflective equilibrium is the only procedure available to justify many of our judgments about reasons for action. However, drawing on his influential account of reflective equilibrium,[1] he argues that reflective equilibrium is a procedure that must, in order to justify, frequently appeal to sound first order judgments about the truth concerning the domain on which one is reflecting. As a result, it cannot serve as a constructivist procedure in the relevant sense.

In his contribution, Nadeem Hussain joins Scanlon in arguing that there is reason to believe that any ambitious constructivism is bound to fail. His case rests crucially on the argument that if constructivism is to be a distinctive meta-ethical position, whether or not the contructivist procedure leads to a certain outcome will itself be a normative issue that will have to be evaluated through another application of the relevant procedure. Any given normative truth gives rise to an infinite hierarchy of procedurally constituted normative facts. But if this is true, Hussain argues that ambitious constructivism will then be subject to Bertrand Russell's "Bishop Stubbs" objection to coherentist theories of truth.

Sharon Street stands out among the proponents of constructivism of the proscribed ambitious sort with her excellent paper. She engages in a "strictly intramural debate" between Kantian constructivism and its Humean rival which she endorses. According to Kantian constructivists, a commitment to substantive moral norms can be derived from within the practical standpoint of any agent. Kantian constructivism thus combines the rejection of realism with a robust form of moral objectivity. Humean constructivism, as Street understands it, is essentially a negative position that shares with its Kantian rival the rejection of realism and the appeal to construction, but combines this with skepticism about a derivation of morality from agency as such. On this Humean view, whether or not a given agent is committed to substantive moral values will be entirely a function of her contingently given valuations. Interestingly, Street suggests that since Humean constructivism is a negative position, the only way in which it can be defended may be through criticism of more ambitious Kantian rivals.

Pursuing this aim, Street takes Korsgaard as her Kantian foil. When Korsgaard defends the value of humanity by presenting it as the answer to the question why we have reason to take anything to be a reason, Street argues that she has pushed the demand for reasons beyond the conditions of its intelligibility. She traces this error to a failure on Korsgaard's part to grasp unflinchingly the core insight of constructivism: that all value arises from within the practical perspective of some agent. Throughout Street's essay, echoes of Philippa Foot from various stages in her career can be heard, in the picture of morality as contingent but no less dear for that. This is especially so in Street's amusing thought experiment involving the evolution of a rational species of social insect, complete with meta-ethicists who accept constructivism but consistently and joyously affirm that only their queen has value.[2]

Other forms of constructivism are defended, adumbrated, or put to work in the contributions of Aaron James, Valerie Tiberius, and Yonatan Shemmer. Both Tiberius and James present theories that construct reasons on the basis of a procedure of sound practical judgment. Tiberius' theory draws on Aristotle and ideal observer theories to construct conclusive reasons for actions in terms of the procedure of wise judging. James' theory is an intellectualist one that appeals to constitutive standards of practical judgment that we must grasp in order to fully understand the activity of judgment.Shemmer's piece distinguishes strict norms of instrumental rationality from broader norms of coherence, and provides a constructivist justification of the latter.

The two remaining essays are both critical in nature. Michael Bratman argues that problems arise for Street's constructivism once we acknowledge the fact that we hold values with varying degrees of commitment and identification. Robert Stern deconstructs constructivist arguments against realism on the basis of the value of autonomy. Both are interesting.

As a whole, the anthology is something that anyone who works on constructivism or meta-ethics more generally will probably want to own. Some of the individual essays are worth the entire price of admission. On the other hand, the anthology is somewhat unfocused and highly specialized. One striking absence from its pages is the voice of Korsgaard. She is the direct or indirect target of several essays, and provides the inspiration and animus for the discussion throughout. This absence may not have been for lack of trying, but this reader felt it.

[1] Thomas Scanlon, "Rawls on Justification" in The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, ed. Samual Freeman (CUP: 2003), pp. 139-167.

[2] For morality as resting on contingent commitments, see Philippa Foot, "Morality as a System of Hypothetical Imperatives" in her Virtues and Vices (OUP: 2002), pp. 157-173; for the relativity of normative principles to facts about our species or life-form, see her Natural Goodness (OUP: 2001). Of course, Street's dogged Humeanism is utterly alien to Foot's perspective.