Contemplating Religious Forms of Life

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Mikel Burley, Contemplating Religious Forms of Life: Wittgenstein and D. Z. Phillips, Bloomsbury, 2012, 208pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441103253.

Reviewed by Brian R. Clack, University of San Diego


Mikel Burley's aim is

to elucidate and critically examine some of the most salient contributions of [Ludwig] Wittgenstein and [D. Z.] Phillips to the study of religious forms of life without unhelpfully conflating those contributions into one homogeneous phenomenon called "Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion'. (p. 4)

There is much to commend in the book, though it should at the outset be noted that, to the extent that the book is critical, it tends to be critical of those who stand in opposition to the work of these two philosophers, and that, while it is true that there is no conflation of the two, Wittgenstein is here largely read through Phillips' lens. For reasons that will later be supplied, I am also unsure of the extent to which Burley's thoughts move this particular controversy in philosophy of religion beyond its current, somewhat stagnant condition.

The book falls into two parts, one focused on Wittgenstein and the other on Phillips, each part examining three different aspects of the work of both men. For Wittgenstein, Burley choses as subjects primitive religiosity, the idea of feeling 'absolutely safe', and the possibility of honest religious thinking (that familiar image from Culture and Value of the honest religious thinker as 'a tightrope walker'). This division is a little arbitrary (it might be thought more profitable to clarify the variations in Wittgenstein's early and later thinking about religion). I also feel that Burley's discussions frequently get bogged down in the minutiae of recent discussions, with Wittgenstein's own thought sometimes getting lost amid the details of others' interpretations. This is especially so in the chapter on honest religious thinking, which is largely taken up with a critique of Severin Schroeder's view that there are irresolvable tensions in Wittgenstein's philosophy of religion. This is not to say that Burley does not engage these commentators well, but it would have been good to see more sustained analysis of the meaning of what Wittgenstein himself had to say (about the Last Judgment, for instance). As I will later note, this criticism does not apply to what Burley writes about primitive magical and religious phenomena.

In the part on Phillips, Burley considers the debate concerning realism and non-realism, the meaning of eternal life, and Phillips' use of literature to elucidate religious perspectives. Burley is at his most critical (and rightly so) in the chapter on literature, in which he argues that Phillips' avowedly 'contemplative' approach is undermined by his religious predilections. I think, however, that this criticism should be extended beyond Phillips' tendentious readings of creative writers and poets (such as Tennyson), and applied to his treatment of rival philosophical positions as well. Phillips commonly suggests -- and Burley tends to endorse this -- that his contemplative project consists of a non-evaluative standpoint seeking to explore possibilities of meaning. In practice, however, Phillips is very quick to reject, as in some fashion defective, perspectives other than his own. Note how Burley presents the contemplative view:

His [Phillips'] expressed aim was . . . to elucidate possibilities of meaning in religious language that he considered to have been sorely neglected by both the enemies and the professed friends of religion, and he readily accepted the existence of forms of religious life that diverge from his own examples. (p. 123)

That exemplary open-mindedness is consistently replaced, though, by another attitude, which is in fact aptly described by Burley:

One of the chief tasks that Phillips sets himself . . . is to disclose possibilities of religious meaning beyond the shallow and distorted accounts purveyed by many contemporary philosophers and theologians. (p. 151)

There is clearly a difference between highlighting neglected possibilities and setting up those possibilities in relation to 'shallow and distorted accounts'. Phillips frequently goes beyond the purely contemplative project when he castigates certain beliefs and practices as being 'confused' or 'superstitious'. As many critics have argued, the distinction Phillips unwaveringly drew between 'religion' and 'superstition' is unworkable and unhelpful, and it compromises the supposedly contemplative nature of his undertaking.[1]

Other than this nascent objection, Burley is engaged in a robust defense of Phillips' work, keen to expose confusion in frequently voiced criticisms of his project and to depict Phillips as 'the victim of philosophical misunderstandings' (p. 106). Phillips himself not infrequently made claims of this kind, but it is hard to be sympathetic, particularly when his work often lacks the kind of clarity supposed to be essential in a follower of Wittgenstein. (Wittgenstein, it must be recalled, wrote that 'the clarity we are aiming for is complete clarity. But this simply means that that the philosophical problems should completely disappear'[2]).

Just such a lack of clarity is found in Phillips' contributions to the debate about realism and non-realism, for example. While it is true that there is indeed something artificial about the terms of that debate, the Wittgensteinian emphasis upon conceptual clarification as an alternative to the debate may strike one as part of an attempt to sidestep an obvious (though not necessarily naïve) question, that of whether or not there actually is a God. Of course it is true that such a question should not be asked without paying due attention to the context in which religious utterances concerning God arise and have their life. It is true likewise (as Phillips and Burley both protest) that philosophers of religion have been neglectful of that context. But that does not mean that, after all due contextualizing and grammatical clarification has taken place, one might not ask the question (which is by no means the preserve of context-ignoring academic philosophers, but is pondered by all thinking people). It is hard to escape the suspicion (perennially and boringly voiced though it is) that the Wittgensteinian wants to maintain religious practices and beliefs while (surreptitiously) dispensing with the supernatural entities that have traditionally been central to religion. (I realize that Phillips and Burley would reject this talk of 'supernatural entities' as a context-devoid abstraction, but such a rejection strikes me as itself an obfuscatory move.)

Turning to more positive matters, Burley's discussion of Wittgenstein's account of primitive religion is excellent and clear-sighted. It is to be regretted that some of the less attractive aspects of Phillips' thought (such as his idea that a ritual 'says itself')[3] make their presence felt in this chapter. But Burley nonetheless makes some pertinent (and original) points about Wittgenstein's approach. He manifests, for example, a fine awareness (not present in Phillips) of the 'deep and dark recesses within human nature' (p. 5) from which ritual arises, detecting in Wittgenstein's critique of James Frazer's Golden Bough 'a vertical reorientation of attention downwards or inwards, into the depths of human animal instincts' (p. 24). Burley also opens up a promising way of looking at the nature of the 'kinship' Wittgenstein hopes to establish between 'us' (that is, people living in technologically advanced societies) and traditional peoples. Wittgenstein's method of placing an exotic rite (say, effigy burning) next to a quasi-ritualistic practice we commonly perform (kissing a photograph) is, Burley says, 'a means of dissolving the gap of unfamiliarity between oneself and an ostensibly alien culture' (p. 24). Thus far, of course, we have a pretty standard reading of Wittgenstein. But Burley goes further: 'In this way, the foreign behaviour is made more familiar, more homely. By the same token, however, our own behaviour may come to be seen as more foreign, more uncanny' (p. 24).

This is a really significant suggestion, worthy of greater elaboration. If developed it could illuminate Wittgenstein's thinking on magical phenomena through a connection with Freud. Particularly useful would be the ideas in 'The "Uncanny"', where Freud explores the strange convergence of the feeling of the homely and the unhomely contained in the sense of the uncanny. He reflects (in a manner comparable to Wittgenstein's) on our relation to certain surmounted beliefs (such as the belief in the omnipotence of thoughts and in the return of the dead).

This mention of Freud raises a bigger issue. The frame of reference of Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion has become rather small and insular. Those seeking to illuminate Wittgenstein's insights appeal to a predictable group of thinkers (e.g., Kierkegaard, Simone Weil, Rush Rhees, Peter Winch). Far less work is being done on figures who both had a strong influence on Wittgenstein and shared his concerns.[4] Freud is one such figure. Wittgenstein, though not uncritical of the founder of psychoanalysis, described himself as 'a disciple of Freud',[5] and insufficient work has been done on the extent of this 'discipleship'.[6] As just noted, Wittgenstein's account of magic might profitably be reconsidered in light of this influence (both men, interestingly, stress the role of wishes in the practice of magic), while there are two other places in Burley's book where reference to Freud might have proved useful.

In the first, Burley links Phillips' methodological 'hermeneutics of contemplation' with Wittgenstein's conception of 'peace' as the goal of philosophy, seeing in both of these approaches 'a religious orientation to life' (p. 174). There is, of course, another way of looking at Wittgenstein's approach to philosophy. It is to see him engaged in something akin to a psychotherapeutic activity, with philosophical problems characterized along the lines of neurotic disorders and requiring a comparable cure: 'The philosopher's treatment of a question is like the treatment of an illness.'[7] The peace produced by this is less a kind of religious serenity and more a release from mental torment. The connection here with Freud should barely require comment.

In the second, Burley's analysis of the 'absolute safety' idea arguably suffers from seeking illumination among the 'usual suspects'. As is well known, in 'Lecture on Ethics', Wittgenstein spoke of feeling 'absolutely safe' in these terms: 'I am safe, nothing can injure me whatever happens'. Burley (following Winch's familiar essay 'Can a Good Man be Harmed?') explores this in relation to thoughts by Socrates and Kierkegaard among others. He brings out a religious sense in Wittgenstein's words: 'there is a perspective from which everything, without exception, is all right' (p. 50). (Worryingly, this suggests that all instances of suffering -- his specific example being mental illness -- could be seen as 'a manifestation of God's love', p. 51. Such talk should always be avoided, I think). I would be inclined to explore a different way of considering this remark, connecting it with a line from Christian Dietrich Grabbe'sHannibal which is used by Freud time and again. Writing to Karl Abraham at the start of the First World War, for example, he tells about the hardships being experienced in Vienna, and comments:  'We cannot fall out the world, that is the greatest safeguard'.[8] In Civilization and its Discontents, Freud connects Grabbe's thought to a purportedly religious 'oceanic feeling', and attempts an explanation of the roots of that feeling. That explanation need not concern us here, and I highlight this simply to indicate one of the possible (and less familiar) paths that an investigation of Wittgenstein's account of religion might take.

While this review of Contemplating Religious Forms of Life has largely been critical, it should also be stated that Burley undertakes his task with energy and a pleasing style. He displays a thorough grasp of recent discussions concerning the impact both Wittgenstein and Phillips have had on philosophy of religion, and he engages well with those discussions. My dissatisfaction is rather with the state of those discussions themselves. I find that their reflections on Wittgenstein's endlessly fascinating thoughts on magic and religion are hamstrung by the stranglehold that Phillips and his supporters have exerted on the subject and by an unwillingness to look for illumination beyond those ubiquitously employed thinkers listed above. This is not to say that Wittgenstein does not manifest some affinities with such thinkers as Kierkegaard and Weil. But to use that phrase again, it might be time to look at some other, neglected possibilities.

[1] See, for example, Brian R. Clack, 'D. Z. Phillips, Wittgenstein and Religion' (Religious Studies, 31 (1995), pp. 111-120), and Terrence W. Tilley, 'The Philosophy of Religion and the Concept of Religion: D. Z. Phillips on Religion and Superstition' (Journal of the American Academy of Religion, 68 (2000), pp. 345-356).

[2] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1953), §133.

[3] See Brian R. Clack, 'Response to Phillips' (Religious Studies, 39, (2003), pp. 203-209).

[4] William James DeAngelis' Ludwig Wittgenstein -- A Cultural Point of View (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2007) is a notable exception to this oversight.  DeAngelis draws provocative and enlightening connections between Wittgenstein and Oswald Spengler .

[5] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1966), p. 41.

[6] Though see Gordon Baker's fascinating later work (Wittgenstein's Method: Neglected Aspects (Oxford: Blackwell, 2004)), tragically interrupted by his early death, in which he explores the relationship between Wittgenstein's method and psychoanalysis.

[7] Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, §255.

[8] Ernst Falzeder (ed.), The Complete Correspondence of Sigmund Freud and Karl Abraham (London: Karnac, 2002), p. 269.