Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Stephen C. Angle, Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy, Polity, 2012, 204pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745661308.

Reviewed by Tongdong Bai, Fudan University


In a recent online poll on the ranking of specialties in terms of their importance to a strong (American?) Ph. D. program in philosophy, "history of non-Western Philosophy" was voted the twenty-sixth among the twenty-seven specialties considered,[1] prompting Stephen C. Angle, whose most recent book I am reviewing here, to post on a blog on Chinese and comparative philosophy with the title "We are not last . . . "[2]. The irony is painfully obvious. The situation, though, may not be so bad. My impression is that more courses on Chinese philosophy are offered in American colleges, which translates into more hiring in this field, perhaps thanks to the economic rise of China and to political correctness in America. But for the same reasons, courses that touch upon Chinese philosophy are often offered as "diversity" courses, or courses of cultural and area studies, thus not really "hard-core" philosophy courses. For philosophy is still generally considered universal, beyond space (area), time, and peoples. Angle's new book is, in this regard, very timely, as it tries to show the universal nature of Chinese philosophy (Confucianism in particular) through its active engagements with "mainstream" philosophical issues.

Not everyone understands Confucianism in this way. Indeed, in the introduction chapter (Chapter 1), in which he tries to situate his own "Progressive Confucianism," Angle addresses this issue. Angle does not focus on the question of whether Confucianism counts as "real philosophy," which he considers becoming less and less serious–though I think it is still pretty serious.  But he points out, quite convincingly, partly thanks to his awareness of different understandings of what counts as philosophy in the West, that "worries within China that categorizing Confucianism as philosophy [do] violence to key aspects of the tradition" (7). He then offers a very helpful categorization of contemporary Confucians based upon their methodologies, understandings of Confucianism as culturally specific or universal, intellectual resources, etc. Finally, Angle introduces his "Progressive Confucianism," which he takes as a philosophical project in the sense that, although Confucian values are valued in it, they are valued because they are valuable, not because they are Confucian (19).

What makes Angle's project Confucian, in his view, is his reliance, throughout this book, on what he considers the core of Confucianism: "the ideal of all individuals developing their capacities for virtue -- ultimately aiming at sagehood -- through their relationships with one another and with their environment" (2). Moreover, he selectively uses a key idea invented by a twentieth century "New Confucian" Mou Zongsan, the idea of zi wo kan xian, which Angle translates as "self-restriction." In Chapter 2, he offers perhaps one of the most intelligible explanations of this rather opaque concept. Mou rejected both a direct connection between morality and politics, or the idea that an alleged sage with direct, intuitive grasp of moral reality should assume absolute political authority, which seems to be a feature of traditional Confucianism, and a lack of connection, which seems to be the dominant view of contemporary liberalism. The concept of self-restriction is to make this balancing act possible. Mou was deeply influenced by Kant, and I think that Mou's use of self-restriction to deny both a direct connection and no connection between morality and politics is modeled after Kant's attempt to reconcile determinism in the natural world with the free will of a moral agent, both of which are governed by reason.

In Angle's reconstruction, the argument is as follows. As the aforementioned core Confucian ideal implies, Confucians, as individuals, are committed to seeking full virtue. But Confucians deny a sharp distinction between the private and the public, meaning that an individual's cultivation of full virtue is not merely this individual's personal matter, but a public (political) one. One cannot become a sage alone, and the endless process of becoming a sage is only achieved if everyone in the world becomes a sage. For anyone to cultivate full (and true) virtue, there must be a public sphere that allows active moral agency. Morally superior persons should not impose their morals on others, meaning that they have to restrict themselves, in spite of their moral superiority (thus "self-restriction). The restriction is ultimately achieved through external political structures that guarantee rights to exercise moral agency. Through this reconstruction of Mou's arguments for self-restriction, Angle shows that a constitution, laws, and rights are not merely compatible with Confucianism -- a stance many Confucian scholars (such as Joseph Chan) take (see also Angle's discussion in Chapter 5, 82-84)-- but are required by it. Although Mou sometimes argued that this self-restriction is inherent in some pre-existing Confucian texts, Angle believes that it is a addition to Confucianism.

With the basic ideas (the core Confucian ideal and the idea of self-restriction) of Progressive Confucianism articulated, it is rather easy for us to see that political participation should then be all-inclusive (although children are still excluded from full membership (51)). Angle thus rejects the authoritarian version of Confucianism. But due to the Confucian denial of a sharp division between the private and the public, "participation can take many forms" (55). Moreover, "equality-for-equality's-sake is not a goal of Progressive Confucianism" (and I would add not a goal of any form of Confucianism if it deserves the name of Confucianism). Angle is open to voting systems other than one person, one vote (55-57).

In Chapter 4, Angle discusses past Chinese thinkers' views and his own view on the issue of rule of law and virtue politics. He agrees with the reasons Mou and another Chinese thinker, Zhang Shizhao, give "to be very cautious about any political institution designed on the premise that the more virtuous should rule over the less virtuous," and shares their friendly attitude toward "the idea that the virtuous should contribute to politics" (73).

From his reconstruction of Mou's concept of self-restriction, we already have seen how Angle would argue that human rights are not merely compatible with, but required by Progressive Confucianism. In addition to elaborating on the aforementioned relevant points, in his concluding chapter, he tries to answer a challenge raised by Justin Tiwald that the mere existence of rights or rights-claiming activities may endanger the Confucian social fiber or harmony (84). Angle distinguishes between substantial violations of rights, in which rights-claiming is justified, and cases of accidental, slight, or no violations of rights, in which rights-claiming should not be encouraged (142-144). On the issue of how to formulate universal principles of human rights, inspired by a contemporary Chinese thinker Zhao Tingyang's understanding of tian xia (all under heaven), Angle argues that we have to view the world from the perspective of the world, meaning that the universal, world perspective must be arrived at through an all-inclusive process, "rather than universalizing a single perspective" (89). In this sense, he differs even from the Rawlsian approach in the Law of Peoples, which is still generated from a liberal standpoint while decent societies are not consulted on the formulation of universal norms (note 48, 167). But this is perhaps because Angle's Confucianism is too light on Confucianism and too heavy on progressivism. That is, a thicker and less progressive Confucianism would exclude the participation of certain unreasonable and even decent peoples, as Rawls would.

In Chapter 6 (and part of Chapter 7), Angle illustrates beautifully the functions and values of rituals. This is an attempt to answer Thomas Metzger's challenge that the West has, and China lacks, the idea of civility, or "doable virtues that any decent person could practice" (91). Angle argues that rituals offer the cultivation of such virtues. After criticizing the "maximalist" view of rituals (some of his points here I don't think are always fair), he defends a minimalist version, which even some non-Confucian thinkers (such as Cheshire Calhoun) would endorse. According to it, rituals both discipline the practitioners and are expressions of them. A ritual of showing respect both expresses respect and disciplines the performer to be respectful; it forms this person's individual identity and also nurtures a world of rituals. The underlying idea is the Confucian recognition that ethical growth is both individual-based and profoundly relational, an insight resonating with such contemporary therapies as couples' and family therapies. With regard to their disciplining or guiding function, according to Angle, rituals help us to discover the right things to do by structuring "situations such that people can readily respond in apt ways" (113). Rituals have such a role because, according to the early Confucian Xunzi, they were introduced by the sages. This point (and a few other points that don't sound very progressive), however, is not mentioned, let alone developed, by Angle. Confucians, according to Angle, understand the two roots of human behaviors, inner character traits and external situations, an understanding supported by modern psychology. But ultimately, the Confucian ideal is to achieve moral fixity or stability, without the help of situations or rituals, a point which Angle cites Xunzi to support (113-114). Rituals have functions not only in our moral cultivation, but in our political activities as well. For example, Angle agrees with Paul Woodruff on the idea that "voting is a ritual as much as it is a law-governed political institution" (108).

For Angle, Confucianism advocates the moral cultivation of all, and clearly, an oppressive political environment opposes this goal. Thus, Confucians are against oppression. But with Confucianism commonly understood as a virtue-oriented doctrine, oppression (including gender inequality) as a political issue has not been adequately understood and taken seriously by Confucians, a problem Progressive Confucianism is meant to solve. (But some of Angle's criticisms of the inadequacies of Confucianism, in my view, are not really fair.) According to Angle, "Oppression has three major negative consequences on virtue or character development. First, it can make it more difficult for an individual to develop character traits that are widely recognized as virtuous" (125). Second, it can encourage so-called "burdened virtues," traits that are useful in an oppressive society, but problematic in non-oppressive ones (125). Third, even the privileged in an oppressive society suffer from the so-called "ordinary vices of domination" (125). Thus, Confucians who are concerned with the cultivation of full (and right) virtue should be actively against oppression. Meanwhile, they should also advocate non-oppressive hierarchy and deference ("Deference never properly calls for rigid submission" (130)), because they are essential Confucian values, and are inevitable and valuable in human societies.

In addition to summing up his main points, in his Conclusion Angle makes two other interesting points. First, for Progressive Confucians, the state should not be completely value-neutral, as many liberals would advocate, or take the communitarian path, but should offer "moderate perfectionist" education through Confucian exemplars, texts, and rituals (141-142). Second, seeing the problem of Confucians in the past who did not have a stable power base or an institutional home, Angle suggests that Confucians can exert their power not by making Confucianism a state religion, as some so-called "Institutional Confucians" have hoped, but through a secular and progressive Confucian party.

In spite of his emphasis on the centrality of moral metaphysics, Mou himself developed a "new politics" as a Confucian political philosophy. But many critics of Mou have seen it "as simply the grafting of Western liberal democracy onto Confucianism, with the seemingly mysterious idea of self-restriction providing the hocus-pocus to make the combination seem tenable" (136). To demystify the concept of self-restriction and to show that a version of New Confucian politics, i.e., Progressive Confucianism, is distinctively Confucian are the contributions Angle wishes to make. A committed critic of New Confucianism, I have to applaud Angle's undertakings, especially his effort to make the concept of self-restriction intelligible, which I consider a great success. Moreover, he states that his Progressive Confucianism "endeavors to capture the actual importance of self-restriction to our understanding of the dependencies among three types of values: ethical, political, and ritual" (136), which I consider thought-provoking. I think, however, that there are other Confucian resources that admit of the fallibility of even a sage and the necessity of moral agency and would would do the trick Angle wants the idea of self-restriction to do).

But here also lies a problem I have with Angle's book. It might be more accurately titled "Progressive Confucianism" or "Progressive Confucian Trinity" rather than "Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy," as its focus and attractiveness are the aforementioned dependencies and tensions, rather than a full-scale political philosophy per se. More importantly, a key challenge to Mou Zongsan's brand of New Confucianism is largely left unaddressed: can Confucianism make any constructive and systematic contributions to fundamental issues in political philosophy other than being only a "cheerleader" (a sincere one, as Angle tries to show) of liberal democracy? To be fair, Angle does defend the value of rituals and advocate a moderate perfectionism, among other more distinctively Confucian features, which some liberal thinkers don't support or don't pay attention to (while some others do, as Angle himself points out in this book). But these are "tinkering" jobs at best.

In contrast, Contemporary Confucian political thinkers, such as Daniel Bell, Jiang Qing and I, don't believe that history ends with liberal democracy, and try to offer alternatives, such as a hybrid regime that combines democratic elements with meritocratic elements, which is to replace the institution of one person, one vote. Angle entertains this possibility, but doesn't discuss it in any detail. Another example is found in Chapter 5, where Angle insightfully grasps a tension between "the self-determination of individual nation-states" and "the border-transcending rights of individual people," exacerbated by the fact that "the state is both the 'principle violator and essential protector' of human rights" (74). But then he goes on with the existing doctrine of the Responsibility to Protect (75). In contrast, Daniel Bell and I have been offering Confucian models of state identity and international relations that address this dilemma. It is a pity that we don't see any similar endeavors by Angle, who is the right person to undertake this kind of task.

Another major reservation I have concerns how Confucian Progressive Confucianism is. The main ideas this book relies on are the aforementioned core Confucian ideal and the concept of self-restriction, which make the Confucian part of Progressive Confucianism rather thin. Confucianism is also a very long tradition, a big tent under which, at times, there were strongly opposed schools. Some of the reviews of historical Confucian ideas offered in this book are sketchy and randomly selected, and others, including the core ideal, represent only a particular kind of Neo-Confucianism and New Confucianism. Some issues, such as the authority and flexibility of rituals, are amply addressed in Confucian classics, which Angle doesn't go into at all. All these are reasons for me and some other so-called "Neo-Classical Confucians" (a nice label given by Angle) to favor an approach more based on classical texts.

In spite of these reservations and differences, I think that this book is highly valuable not only to philosophers sympathetic to the Confucian tradition, but to all political and moral philosophers. For Angle is not only well-read in the Confucian tradition, but also in the Western philosophical tradition. But in spite of, or maybe because of his erudition, he is able to communicate his insightful ideas in a way any philosophical reader can understand, appreciate, and be inspired by.