Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art

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Matthew Kieran (ed.), Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art, Blackwell Publishing, 2005, 384pp., $36.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405102403.

Reviewed by Jenefer Robinson, University of Cincinnati


This book is a collection in a Blackwell series, in which pairs of authors dispute central topics in a field. Reading it is an exhilarating experience: I found myself continually wanting to get involved in the disputes and write a few rebuttals and defenses of my own. The papers are all written especially for the collection. The editor, Matthew Kieran, has chosen his topics and authors well.

David Davies ably attacks the view he calls "enlightened empiricism," in particular, the doctrine that "the artistic value of a work resides in qualities of the experience it elicits in an appropriately primed receiver" (23). He points out that many factors enter into our assessments of artistic value that "are not reducible to the experienced effects of works" (27), notably the achievements of artists. If I come to recognize Turner's "pictorial intelligence" in one of his paintings, for example, my experience of the work may be modified, but the value I find in the work doesn't consist in my experience of it; it is only because of my "prior recognition" of the value in the work that I experience it differently (28). His opponent is Gordon Graham, whose concerns are a little tangential to Davies'.

Graham agrees that the value of artworks is often partly dependent on their historical context -- a fake Vermeer does not have the value of a real one -- and that this implies that a strong version of aesthetic empiricism must be rejected. In particular he rejects the Kantian notion of aesthetic appreciation, according to which we are merely invited to pay attention to the intrinsic properties of a work. What he is mainly concerned to establish, however, is that Duchamp's ready-mades should be rejected on the same grounds as fakes. The argument is strained. Graham thinks that ready-mades assume "a Kantian-style aesthetic" (18), whereas genuine aesthetic judgment is a "form of engagement," and that there is nothing in ready-mades to engage us aesthetically. But it is doubtful that ready-mades were intended to be the subject of a Kantian gaze. Indeed, they seem much more readily explained in Davies' terms as actions or performances by an artist, the artistic success of which depends principally on the artist's achievement, if any.

On a related topic, Robert Stecker and Daniel Nathan cross swords on the relevance of artist's intentions to the interpretation of artworks. Stecker, taking linguistic utterances as his model, argues for "moderate intentionalism" according to which

an utterance means X if the utterer intends X, the utterer intends that his or her audience will grasp this in virtue of the conventional meaning of the words or a contextually supported extension of this meaning permitted by conventions, and the first intention is graspable in virtue of those conventions or permissible extensions of them. (274)

Nathan defends the anti-intentionalist position, arguing that the idea that artists' intentions are crucial to determining the meaning of an artwork gets any plausibility it has from a faulty analogy between an artwork and a piece of language designed to communicate a speaker's meaning, as in a conversation, for example. But, says Nathan, artworks such as poems are not like conversations at all; in engaging with an artwork, we are inherently "observers, not participants in a conversation." Art is "a historically embedded practice … that includes conventions that in some way set normative parameters for both artist and interpreters of art" (291), and the best interpretation is one "that can make the best sense of the greatest number of features available in the work." In Nathan's view, "only the intention revealed in the work itself -- the embodied intentions, so to speak -- will matter" (292). Nathan makes many of the same points as Beardsley in his original attack on intentionalism, and he is open to the same criticisms: for example, specifying "the intentions revealed in the work" means specifying to whom they are "revealed." The answer lies in what Richard Wollheim calls the "cognitive stock" that an audience needs to have in order to interpret a work appropriately, and one of the things that it is usually useful to have in one's cognitive stock is some idea of what an artist thinks she is up to in making the work.

In a discussion of aesthetic experience, Noel Carroll criticizes the "affect-oriented approach" (71), which identifies the aesthetic with a particular type of feeling; the "epistemic approach," which claims that aesthetic experience involves coming to know its object "directly" (77); and the "axiological approach," that identifies aesthetic experience "in terms of the kind of value it is thought to secure, typically intrinsic value or value for its own sake" (81). Having, he thinks, demolished all three theories, he concludes that we should accept the only one left, namely the "content-oriented approach," according to which

if attention is directed with understanding to the form of the artwork, and/or to its expressive or aesthetic properties, and/or to the interaction between these features, and/or to the way in which the aforesaid factors modulate our response to the artwork, then the experience is aesthetic. (89)

The view focuses on experiencing artworks rather than nature. It also seems to entail -- implausibly -- that if I merely note the colors in a sunset or the shape of a melody, I am having an "aesthetic experience" regardless of whether I am in any way moved by what I see or hear. Gary Iseminger defends a version of the "axiological" approach, so he has to answer a counter-example by Carroll: two people, an "aesthete" and an evolutionary psychologist, who have the same experience of a piece of music despite the fact that the psychologist believes that the value of the experience is instrumental rather than intrinsic. Iseminger argues that it is not the valued experience (hearing the melody, for example) that is the aesthetic experience but the valuing of that experience for its own sake: the aesthete, unlike the psychologist, is in "an aesthetic state of mind" insofar as she values the experience (they are both having) for its own sake and the psychologist doesn't. This reply suggests that "valuing an experience" is a "state of mind," something that perhaps Carroll would deny. If one were keeping score, this debate would seem to end in a draw, with more work needed on both sides.

Alan Goldman scores a clearer victory over George Dickie, however, on the issue of whether there are general "aesthetic principles" of evaluation. Dickie suggests that some aesthetic properties -- elegance, unity -- always count positively "when considered in isolation from … other properties" (308) of a work. But Goldman rightly notes that even such weak general principles fail: a performance of the Rite of Spring can be too elegant. If it is objected that the elegance is a negative property only because of the other properties with which it is interacting, Goldman replies that this is unavoidable: it makes no sense to look for principles about elegance or unity independently of any context. And in an unkind cut, he points out that Dickie's claim that "monotony, as a form of unity, is valuable in itself" (309) reduces the argument to the absurd. If there are no general aesthetic principles, then we need to know how to determine aesthetic value. Here Goldman falls back on a Humean solution, with all the problems this entails: "Real critics are justified in their judgments to the extent that they approximate to ideal critics" (310). Critics' evaluative judgments can be justified by appeal to "the work itself to indicate the proper response, and implicitly to their own expertise, familiarity with the type of work, and so on" (310). Errors remain possible "to the extent that actual critics fall short of ideal judges in knowledge, attentiveness, and so on" (310).

Berys Gaut defends the view that the value of literature is partly cognitive: "art can non-trivially teach us and … this (partly) determines its artistic value" (115). In this essay, he makes large cognitive claims for the imagination, for example, that I can learn "something about how courageous I am by imagining myself being tortured and contemplating how I react," as well as "what it is like to be a bereaved woman whose husband has died after sixty years of marriage by imagining myself in her position" (116). This seems to me highly unlikely. If we really want to know these things, the best way to find out is to study empirical data about how people in general behave in these situations. This of course will provide only statistical probabilities, not knowledge about individuals, but at least it has some claim to be knowledge. Gaut suggests that we can "test" the claims of literature "by discovering whether or not the called-for imaginative projection is one with which we concur or is one which we resist" (119). Thus if we are asked to imagine in Scene two of King Lear that Lear apologizes to Cordelia, "we would imaginatively resist this outcome; we might exclaim 'I can't imagine him doing that!'" (119) But of course we can. It's just that the play would have been a different one, and King Lear a different character from the one Shakespeare invented. In the companion piece to Gaut's, Lamarque happily accepts the cognitivists' claim that proper appreciation of literary works entails engaging with and reflecting upon their content, but he also rightly insists that the cognitivist gives undue "prominence to truth and knowledge as a locus of literary value in this reflective process" (137). Lamarque, I think, is correct that the most important cognitive values -- truth, reasoned argument, and knowledge -- are not what literature is mainly concerned to promote. However, in arguing that literary value requires seeing how well the subject illuminates the theme and how cleverly the theme is exemplified by the subject, he is implicitly endorsing the importance of relations that are basically cognitive.

Another debate features rival views about the uses of imagination in our engagement with artworks. Gregory Currie defends his simulation account of imagination, while acknowledging that engaging imaginatively with artworks does not always (or even often) involve "putting ourselves in the shoes" of the fictional characters. Rather it typically involves "impersonal simulation," for example, taking on "the imaginative counterpart" of -- and thereby simulating -- the belief that Peter Pan is in danger or that Hook is afraid of the crocodile, without thereby simulating the mental states of any "particular person, real or imagined," who holds this belief (212-3). Jonathan Weinberg and Aaron Meskin take him to be claiming that "we can explain the particular psychological transactions of a reader using imagined beliefs, desires, and so forth in the exact same way that we can explain parallel transactions by a person with the corresponding real beliefs, desires, and so forth" (229), and they object that there are cases in which our real beliefs concerning the genre of a work or the "star power" of a (real-life) movie hero affect our simulated beliefs or desires regarding the fiction. They postulate two distinct "representational systems" -- a belief system and an imagination system -- with "mechanisms that bridge the two systems" (231). Both can drive the affect system, but the imagination system isn't connected to the action-guidance system. I find it hard to adjudicate between these two views. Currie's "impersonal simulation" just seems to be another way of talking about "imagining that so-and-so is the case." It's unclear to me what work the concept of "simulation" is doing here. But Weinberg and Meskin's alternative is equally vacuous: of course imagining and believing are different "systems" and of course there are connections between them. Currie would not disagree. On the other hand, Currie's more specific proposal that sometimes empathy, understood in this context as simulation of characters' mental states, can sometimes play a crucial role in "the reader's response" to a novel is both more interesting and more plausible. Specifically, he claims that few readers would "stay the course" in reading Anne Brontë's The Tenant of Wildfell Hall without the "encouragement" they get from empathizing with the main characters on specific occasions (219).

On the question whether emotional responses to fictions can be both genuine and rational, Tamar Gendler and Karson Kovakovich argue that, because, as Antonio Damasio has shown, simulated emotions play a crucial role in decision-making, and because they are "strikingly similar" (248) to emotions we experience for fictional characters and events, such "fictional emotions may contribute to our capacity for rational action" (252). One problem with this argument is that it seems to suggest that Damasio's "somatic markers" are uniformly helpful in rational decision-making. But unfortunately this is not so. "Somatic markers" help us to make decisions by "marking" certain classes of scenario as good or bad. But such "gut reactions" frequently reinforce irrational stereotypes. Derek Matravers does not attempt to present an alternative position on the issue, but instead gives a subtle and insightful account of the arguments against "irrationalism," i.e. the view that emotions for fictional characters are irrational. He concludes that there is no "decisive refutation of irrationalism," while admitting that it is counter-intuitive to think that fiction readers are always acting irrationally, and suggests that "the motivation for irrationalism is the perennial thought that art is a distraction from the proper concerns of morality" (264).

Most of the paired writers really do disagree with each other, but there are exceptions. Eileen John and Daniel Jacobson, discussing the relations between the moral and aesthetic values of art, agree on the main points of contention in this debate. Jacobson, defending "immoralism" or the view that works of art can be "aesthetically valuable for the same reason they are morally suspect" (353), directs most of his criticisms against the views of Noel Carroll and Berys Gaut, both clear examples of "moralists," i.e. those who hold that "whenever a moral defect (or merit) in an artwork is … aesthetically relevant, it must count as an aesthetic defect (or merit)" (346). John defends an "opportunistic moralism" (341) that both embraces and goes beyond immoralism.

The participants in the debate on beauty also fail to disagree. Carolyn Korsmeyer's interesting paper on "Terrible Beauties" argues that beauty is not the only positive aesthetic value. She points out that Burke's distinction between the sublime and the beautiful can be redescribed as a distinction between "easy" beauty or mere (feminine) prettiness, and "difficult" beauty (58), including the (masculine) sublime and, she urges, even "beauty with the arousal of disgust" (61). She proposes that the negative emotions of fear in the sublime and disgust in her special cases intensify enjoyment and become beautiful because "they capture in a breathtaking manner something terrible that we may also recognize as true" (63). Korsmeyer's thesis seems to draw on the insight (if it is one) that beauty is truth, rather than a source of merely perceptual pleasure. Although it goes beyond anything Marcia Eaton wants to claim in her companion piece, nevertheless the two papers agree on a fundamental principle that, as Eaton says, "it is philosophical folly to try to link 'beauty' or 'ugliness' to a single precise definition" (40).

Jerrold Levinson's paper on expressiveness is mainly devoted to defending a modified version of his earlier theory: "a passage of music P is expressive of an emotion E if and only if P, in context, is readily heard, by a listener experienced in the genre in question, as an expression of E" (193). By contrast, he describes Davies as holding that the "expressiveness of music consists in its presenting emotion-characteristics-in-appearance," (196) which resemble human expressive behavior. Levinson then questions "how similar such an appearance must be to one presented by human behavior in order to constitute an emotion-characteristic-in-sound of the emotion in question" (197) or "how similar the experience of musical movement and of expressive behavior must be" (197), and argues that the "only way to anchor 'sad musical appearance' … is in terms of our disposition to hear such music as sad." I don't think Davies would disagree. Indeed, he implicitly answers this criticism by emphasizing that what matters is the experience of resemblance between "music's temporally unfolding dynamic structure" and "configurations of human behavior associated with the expression of emotion" (181) and arguing that this experience of resemblance is shaped by our human interests: we naturally and unthinkingly experience the world as similar to human experience, thought and behavior. So we don't need to inquire "how much" resemblance is necessary; a very little resemblance could be enough to anchor the experience. Davies and Levinson are in fact much closer to each other than either seems willing to acknowledge. The main substantive difference between them in my view is that Levinson insists that expression requires an expresser, an agent or persona heard or imagined in the music, whereas Davies thinks it is enough for music to exhibit a sequence of "expressions" independent of any expresser. Both agree, however, that the experience of expressiveness is an experience of "hearing-as."

In one of the best altercations, Rob Hopkins and Dom Lopes argue about pictorial representation. Hopkins' paper is a model of its kind, beautifully argued and perspicuous, but his view is basically a version of old-fashioned resemblance theory of a kind that I had thought Goodman had forever laid to rest. Hopkins claims that a picture P depicts something O, if and only if (1) O can be seen in P, which Hopkins glosses as "P is experienced as resembling O in outline shape (151)," and (2) the explanation for (1) is either that someone intended that P be experienced as resembling O in outline shape or that "P is causally related in the right way to O" (151). This view seems to work well for realistic pictures in classical perspective. The challenge is to see how it fits non-realistic pictorial symbol systems, such as caricature (Churchill as a lion with Churchillian brow, mouth and cigar and a lion's mane) or Cubism (Dora Maar with a hexagonal head, one eye facing straight ahead and the other facing to one side). Hopkins says that if a picture depicts something with "distorted features" then the pictorial configuration will be experienced as resembling Churchill or Dora Maar "with distorted features" (152). This, he says, "is how the view makes room for the possibility of pictorial misrepresentation" (152). But neither of my examples misrepresents its subject: Churchill really was leonine, as the caricaturist suggests. And Picasso is attributing to Dora Maar properties she really has: seen from different angles Dora Maar has the appearance of eyes looking straight forward or of eyes looking to the side. A distorted picture of Dora Maar is not an (accurate) picture of a distorted Dora Maar. Hopkins is implicitly denying the importance of style: pictures are not all experienced as resembling their depicta in outline shape, because artists are interested in many things other than the resemblance in appearance between a picture and what it depicts. Lopes' paper defends the rival recognition theory of depiction:

A picture P depicts something O if and only if (1) P is able to trigger the capacity of a suitable perceiver in suitable viewing conditions to recognize an O by its appearance, and (2) the satisfaction of (1) is a consequence of a causal relation of the right kind between O and P. (169)

Lopes' paper is a little baroque, but the view it defends is plausible. He examines a number of intriguing counter-examples to Hopkins' view, such as the well-known "invisible dalmation," whose outline shape becomes visible only after we have detected a dog in the picture, and "the shadow," pictures that have identical outline shape but only some of which can be seen as a face (rather than, say, a map of a peninsula); heavy contrast between light and shadow is crucial in addition to outline shape. Against Lopes, Hopkins objects that the recognition theory of depiction does not explain the difference between our experience of painting and of sculpture. It seems clear that this debate, like many of the others in this volume, is far from over.

In summary, this is a very good book, giving an excellent snapshot of the state of Anglo-American analytic aesthetics, and revealing it to be in the best of health. It would also be a good choice for an advanced undergraduate or graduate course in analytic Aesthetics.