Contemporary Debates in Cognitive Science

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Robert J. Stainton (ed.), Contemporary Debates in Cognitive Science, Blackwell, 2006, 360pp., $34.95, ISBN 140511305.

Reviewed by Justin Fisher, University of British Columbia


Contemporary Debates in Cognitive Science is an excellent introduction to debates in the philosophy of cognitive science. Many of this volume's 18 previously unpublished papers also provide overviews of recent work by the authors, so this would also be a good choice for those who would like to keep up with the latest thinking of many leaders in the field.

The volume is organized as a series of debates regarding various topics in the philosophy of Cognitive Science. The papers make frequent reference to one another, and generate the feel of self-contained debates within a single volume, which helps make this a good potential text for upper-level courses in the philosophy of mind or cognitive science. Some papers offer overviews of the debates, but it would have been useful if the volume had also included a more neutral introduction to each debate, offering novices the lay of the land.

One highlight of the volume is the opening three-way debate about modularity. Is the mind composed out of many modules monkishly minding their respective tasks? Or is it instead composed out of gossipy busybodies who share information quite freely?

Peter Carruthers opens this debate with three theoretical arguments in favor of monkish modules. The first is an argument from analogy: since evolution built bodies out of hierarchies of neatly dissociable components (organs, tissues, cells) we should expect it to have built minds that way too. It's not clear, however, that minds are enough like bodies that we should expect them to display similar design features. E.g., geometry places strong engineering constraints on bodies, whereas we know that brains include many long-distance connections, relatively unconstrained by geometry. Even if monkish components are best suited for doing heavy labor within strong geometric constraints, it might still be that garrulous busybodies are better suited to the more cerebral information-processing tasks that are essential to cognition.

Second, Carruthers argues that the diversity of cognitive tasks invites a division of labor among mental components. However, as he acknowledges, one needn't be monkish to be specialized. For all this argument shows, the mind might be populated by diverse busybodies who simply gossip in different ways.

Third, Carruthers argues that a measure of monkishness is required to avoid overwhelming computational difficulties: busybodies who continually stick their noses into everyone else's affairs won't be able to get their own tasks done. As Carruthers acknowledges, these considerations yield only the conclusion that no component of the mind can usefully stick its nose everywhere at once, but not the traditional modularist's conclusion that each component of the mind must always focus, monkishly, on the very same limited range of affairs.

On the opposite side of the debate, Jesse Prinz examines a great deal of empirical evidence, and finds it to weigh against thinking that any interesting class of mental components might be demarcated by the sorts of monkish characteristics traditionally associated with modularity. For example, brain areas, like Broca's and Wernicke's areas, that have been thought to subsume linguistic modules apparently are not monkishly dedicated to language, but instead are implicated in recognizing manual actions (Heiser, et al. 2003) and categorizing non-linguistic sounds (Saygin et al. 2003). Or, to take a second example, speech recognition systems don't monkishly concentrate upon incoming sounds, but instead draw upon visual information (McGurk and MacDonald, 1976) and upon information about what interpretations would be semantically plausible in a given context (Warren and Warren, 1970). With a steady stream of examples like these, Prinz builds a compelling case that our minds are primarily populated not by diligent monks, but instead by gossipy busybodies.

Richard Samuels attempts to steer a middle route between Carruthers' monks and Prinz's busybodies. Against Prinz, Samuels suggests that a fan of moderate modularity might allow that some parts of the brain serve as busybody-ish 'shared resources' for multiple cognitive systems, even while other parts are monkish modules. But Broca's and Wernicke's areas were among the most plausible candidates for linguistic modules -- if Samuels concedes that these instead constitute mere 'shared resources', then he'll need to seek new candidate modules and hope that, unlike earlier candidates, these won't be caught with their thumbs in numerous pies. Samuels also suggests that the various instances of cross-system gossip that Prinz identifies might all fall into some small set of quite restrictive categories. Unfortunately, the five categories on Samuels' preliminary list compose a motley crew, and I'm not confident that the completed list will end up seeming all that restrictive. But if Samuels could get this all to work then he might find a stable middle ground, holding that although our mental components aren't exactly monks, there at least are some interesting restrictions on their gossip.

Unfortunately, the volume's other three-way debate is not quite as productive as the first. Barbara Scholz and Geoffrey Pullum open this debate by deriding the "unsavory cavalcade of exaggerated claims [and] tendentious rhetoric" in the literature on linguistic nativism (p. 59). Apparently, they take their own title, "Irrational Nativist Exuberance," to be not at all unsavory, exaggerated or tendentious. Their title notwithstanding, Scholz & Pullum do give a reasonable overview of several senses in which children might plausibly be thought to have innate knowledge of language, and they provide a useful discussion of two fledgling non‑nativist research programs.

In response, Robert Matthews repeatedly sounds the nativist talking point that anti‑nativists don't yet have a well worked out model of language acquisition. In contrast, nativists can offer a model that is at least partially worked out, so Matthews thinks that "the smart money" in this debate would be on them (p. 82). I think the really smart money knows that you don't have to play the only game in town, and Matthews' arguments didn't convince me that we should play it here. I, for one, am saving up my money to bet on models that depict human language acquisition as a symbiotic developmental process involving a genetically evolved homo sapiens child and a culturally evolved natural language symbiont (cf. Deacon 1997).

Matthews passes the nativist banner on to James McGilvray, who argues that, no matter how successful connectionist models of language acquisition might turn out to be, they will be "of no interest to the natural science of language" unless connectionists can demonstrate "that children's developing minds are [connectionist networks] and that they do learn the way that the connectionist empiricist story says they do" (p. 100). I think this is simply wrong. Various highly-touted 'poverty of the stimulus' arguments hold that the stimuli available to children are so impoverished that it would be impossible for a child to acquire linguistic competence without an innate parcel of linguistic knowledge.[1] If a connectionist model can achieve the relevant sorts of linguistic competence from such stimuli without an innate head start, then this would mean that these stimuli are not so impoverished as many theorists have thought, which should be of great interest to the natural science of language.

After these two three-way debates, the volume offers 12 other papers, organized into six two-way debates. I was a bit puzzled by the way in which these papers were divided and ordered. In my presentation, I'll instead group them in a way that strikes me as more natural, and that reflects the groupings (but probably not the ordering) I would use if I were to base a course on this book.

Let's begin with the interesting contribution by Georges Rey. Rey's primary aim is to defend the view that Standard Linguistic Entities (SLEs) like phonemes, morphemes, words and sentences are merely useful fictions that our minds mistakenly represent as actually existing. Rey's skepticism about SLEs stems from his recognition that they can't fall into precisely the same sorts of part-whole relations as do the various components of his Honda Accord. He briefly considers the proposal that SLEs might instead have structure in some "more abstract" sense, perhaps comparable to the way in which "a computer can have abstract computational structure not easily visible in the array of transistors and pieces of metal and plastic of which it is made" (p. 246). Rey quickly dismisses this proposal because he thinks that, unlike abstract computational structures, SLEs cannot be analyzed in terms of dispositions or counterfactuals. I think Rey is too sanguine about our current understanding of actual computational structures and too pessimistic about our potential for understanding abstract linguistic structures as real patterns in the world. But, as you might imagine, this raises many thorny metaphysical issues regarding the sense in which abstract patterns might count as real. These issues are interesting and of foundational importance to cognitive science (cf. Dennett 1991, Pollock forthcoming). Unfortunately Rey's discussion of them is quite perfunctory.

Perhaps one reason Rey didn't go into satisfactory depth was his awkward location in the volume. The most natural location for his central arguments would have been just before Terry Horgan & John Tienson, who present an interesting and useful model involving superposition of waves which shows one way that mental representations might have a sort of internal structure which is not the sort of part-whole structure displayed in Rey's Honda. This then leads naturally to Adele Abrahamsen & William Bechtel's excellent overview of ways in which explanations at different levels of abstraction (e.g., symbolic, connectionist, and dynamical) might work together to help us understand how cognitive systems work.

But Rey's paper was instead situated as the counterpoint to Ray Jackendoff's clarion call for examining the relations between linguistic representations and other mental representations. While few people doubt that such relations are well worth studying, Jackendoff's arguments aren't enough to establish his conclusion that we should focus just on these internal relations, to the exclusion of the relations between linguistic representations and things "out there" in the world. Rey gamely presents his skepticism about SLEs as a more moderate form of Jackendoff's skepticism about all objects of representation, but it would have been much better if Rey had instead used that space to delve a bit more deeply into the metaphysical can of worms he opens, and/or to draw connections to the other papers mentioned above.

The most effective counterpoint to Jackendoff's radical internalism comes (surprisingly) much later in the book, in Timothy Williamson's contribution. Williamson's central point is that good explanations of many of our successful behaviors cite the fact that there was an appropriate sort of correspondence between our internal states and things in the external world. If I am to meet you, my belief about your location had better be coordinated with your actual location. Williamson rightly notes that we can't capture this notion of coordination by talking separately about what beliefs I might have had and what locations you might have had. For any belief I might have had, there are some potential locations that would have fit it, and some that wouldn't. Hence, any strategy (like Jackendoff's) which aims to keep its discussion of internal factors entirely separate from any discussion of external factors will fail to capture facts about whether our internal states are appropriately coordinated with our environments. And hence such strategies will be unable to offer nice general explanations for the many interesting consequences that depend upon such coordination. Williamson develops an extended analogy between (a) attempts to divide cognition into internal and external elements, and (b) attempts to factor composite numbers into prime factors. People who enjoy cleverly crafted formalisms will find Williamson's paper quite enjoyable indeed. However, I worry that, for other readers (especially students or practitioners of other CogSci disciplines), Williamson's central point might get lost in all the formalism.

In his response to Williamson, Ralph Wedgewood acknowledges that one goal of cognitive science is to explain successful behavior, and that this might require incorporating wide factors into our explanations. However, he reasonably asks whether Cognitive Science might have other explananda which admit only narrow explanantia. Unfortunately, Wedgewood's positive argument suffers important gaps. For example, he considers an agent who infers a belief of narrow type T1 from her knowledge that p, which itself is a belief of narrow type T2. Wedgewood asserts,

The probability that the agent will acquire a belief of type T1 is just as high given that she is in the antecedent narrow state of believing a content of type T2 as the probability that she will acquire such a belief given that she is in the antecedent broad state of knowing p. (p. 321)

If this assertion were right, then Wedgewood might have a good case for his conclusion that, in explaining her narrow inference, it would be explanatorily extraneous to note that the agent had knowledge rather than mere belief. But his assertion isn't right, at least not generally. Take the case where the agent knows that the bomb she's carrying isn't about to detonate, as opposed to the case where she merely has the corresponding narrow belief. Contra Wedgewood's assertion, the probability of the agent's surviving to infer a belief of type T1 is indeed higher if she started with actual knowledge that her bomb wouldn't go off, rather than mere belief. More generally, the progression of 'narrow' cognitive states always depends upon external boundary conditions, so there will always be the potential for some wide factors to be probabilistically, and hence explanatorily, relevant to this progression (cf. Fisher forthcoming).

The remaining six papers provide good introductions to three other debates.

Gerd Gigerenzer offers an effective case in favor of using the term 'rational' to describe human reasoning heuristics employed profitably in our normal environments, even if these heuristics would lead us astray in other environments. In response, David Matheson notes that this reference to environments yields the (allegedly disturbing) consequence that our rationality is not entirely under our direct control.

Kirk Ludwig gives an intriguing 'transcendental' argument against believing that our senses systematically deceive us: our only potential reasons for believing this conclusion would be empirical reasons, and hence would be undercut by this conclusion itself. While interesting, this argument offers no positive reason to think that our senses don't deceive us, nor does it rule out thinking that our senses deceive us occasionally. Christopher Viger argues that such occasions are actually quite common. For example, due to the dire consequences of overlooking dangerous predators, mother nature has wisely endowed us with hyper-sensitive motion detectors. While examples like this support the conclusion that our senses often deceive us, and for understandable reasons, they don't support Viger's claim that our perceptual systems don't always aim to be accurate. You can aim to hit a given target while also ensuring that, if you miss, your shot will likely go to a particular side.

No volume on the philosophy of cognition would be complete without a section on consciousness. Bill Lycan provides a nice, and appropriately opinionated, overview of attempts to understand consciousness in terms of representational states that might themselves be hoped to succumb to some sort of naturalistic reduction. As loyal opposition, Brie Gertler approvingly surveys various conceivability arguments that conclude that consciousness is metaphysically independent of everything physical. Gertler claims that introspection provides us with complete knowledge of what's essential to our conscious states, and concludes that we may safely use conceivability as a guide to possibility regarding these issues. In support of this claim, Gertler does little more than note that such figures as Saul Kripke have themselves asserted it. As appeals to authority go, this might be a fairly good one. Still, in a volume on cognitive science, it is quite surprising to see so little discussion about such a remarkable claim to a sort of knowledge completely different from all the sorts of knowledge that cognitive scientists typically study. It would have been especially nice to see consideration of various lines of empirical evidence which call into question our alleged capacity for such rich introspective knowledge (e.g., Dennett and Kinsbourne 1992, Schwitzgebel 2002).

One difficulty in putting together a collection like this is deciding which topics to include. Stainton did a great job gathering papers on a variety of important debates. Other natural additions (to this volume, or to a course based on this volume) would include debates about the nature and cognitive role of emotions, debates about whether modern minds are well-understood as having been shaped by (genetic or cultural) evolutionary selection pressures, and debates about what, if anything, brain scans can tell us about the mind.

Speaking of brain scans, in a field that prides itself in our capacity to build fMRI machines, it's shameful that readers should still have to flip back and forth to read an author's notes. It's high time that we moved from endnotes to footnotes. If one of the worst things I have to say is that this volume made it too difficult to read the notes, then the volume must have been quite good. Indeed it was -- I highly recommend it.

Works Cited.

Deacon, T. (1997). The Symbolic Species: The co-evolution of language and the brain. Norton.

Dennett, D. C., and Kinsbourne, M. (1992). Time and the Observer. Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 15, 183-247.

Dennett, D. C. (1991). Real patterns. Journal of Philosophy, 88, 27-51.

Heiser, M., Iacoboni, M., Maeda, F. Marcus, J., and Mazziota, J. C. (2003). The essential role of Broca's area in imitation. European Journal of Neuroscience, 17, 1123-8.

McGurk, H. and MacDonald, J. (1976). Hearing lips and seeing voices. Nature, 264, 746‑8.

Pollock, J. (forthcoming). What Am I? Virtual machines and the mind/body problem. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.

Schwitzgebel, E. (2002). How Well Do We Know Our Own Conscious Experience? The Case of Visual Imagery. Journal of Consciousness Studies, 9, 35-53.

Saygin, A.P., Dick, F., Wilson, S. M., Dronkers, N. F., and Bates, E. (2003). Neural resources for processing language and environmental sounds: evidence from aphasia. Brain, 126/4, 928-45.

Warren, R. M., and Warren, R. P. (1970). Auditory illusions and confusions. Scientific American, 223, 30-6.

[1] Puzzlingly, McGilvray insists that so-called "poverty of the stimulus (PoS) arguments" are not arguments at all -- instead, PoS observations merely "commend to theorists an internalist, nativist research strategy" (p. 108). I'm afraid I don't see an important difference here. If PoS observations can commend the fruitfulness of a research program that presupposes the truth of linguistic nativism, and if we, as good scientific realists, accept that (approximate) truth is a probable prerequisite for fruitfulness, then PoS observations should be able to constitute an argument for the (approximate) truth of nativism. Regardless, if PoS observations are going to do any of this work, it had better be that the stimulus is impoverished -- so if connectionists can demonstrate that it isn't, that would be important news for the natural science of language.