Contemporary Debates in Metaphysics

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Theodore Sider, John Hawthorne, and Dean W. Zimmerman (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Metaphysics, Blackwell Publishing, 2008, 404pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405112291.

Reviewed by Alan Sidelle, University of Wisconsin-Madison


This is the latest entry in Blackwell's Contemporary Debates in Philosophy series. It comprises nine pairs of papers -- a pair on each of nine central topics in metaphysics. The topics and authors: Abstract Objects (Chris Swoyer -- for, Cian Dorr -- against); Causation and Laws of Nature (John Carroll -- anti-reductive, Jonathan Schaffer -- pro-reduction); Realism about Possible Worlds (Phillip Bricker -- pro, Joseph Melia -- ersatz); Personal Identity (Judith Jarvis Thomson -- bodily view, Derek Parfit -- psychological view, plus, of course, that identity doesn't matter); Time (Dean Zimmermann -- presentism, J.J.C. Smart -- the tenseless view); Three vs. Four Dimensionalism (Ted Sider -- four; John Hawthorne -- exploring the options for three); Free Will (Robert Kane -- Incompatibilism, Libertarianism; Kadri Vihvelin -- Compatibilism); Mereology (James Van Cleve -- Unrestricted Composition, Ned Markosian -- 'Brute' restricted composition); and Metaontology (Eli Hirsch -- ontological disputes are verbal, Matti Eklund -- against ontological relativity). The papers are all written (as you can see) by top contemporary philosophers -- often, by the generally recognized leading defender of the position in question -- and provide what I'd call an 'advanced introduction' to the state of play in these areas. 'Introduction,' in that the essays try not to presuppose familiarity with the issue at hand, and for the most part, are concerned with forcefully laying out what are usually familiar arguments or motivations for the view and/or against alternatives. There are occasional novel twists and ideas, but these aren't (for the most part) the equivalent of journal articles (nor would such articles meet the purposes of the volume). The 'advanced' part is that, while not assuming familiarity with these issues, the papers are written with philosophical sophistication, and I would imagine they would be found difficult by readers without some decent general philosophical background. Of course, this also makes them far more rewarding and valuable than pieces written at a more elementary level. So I'd see this book as most useful in an upper-level survey of metaphysics, or for philosophers who are not themselves metaphysicians, but want to acquaint themselves with these issues (or indeed, even for metaphysicians, but who focus on just a subset of these areas, wanting to get into other realms). For such purposes, this is a nice volume indeed.

That is not to say that there is nothing here for the active metaphysician already in the field. There are interesting suggestions about how to defend against familiar objections, or how to develop some of the positions or lines within them. And many of the entries have some interesting methodological ideas explicitly discussed, such as whether we can countenance inference to the best explanation in non-causal realms, or whether simplicity, parsimony and the like are epistemic, or merely pragmatic virtues, or the epistemic status of our commonsense views. But on the whole, professionals will generally, I think, find themselves skimming most of the entries, while occasionally finding some interesting nugget to dwell upon.

The 'debate' structure of the book -- as well as, no doubt, general space constraints -- puts a 'two-sided' gloss on some disputes in which there are more than two competing positions. Those planning on using this for a class might want to supplement it with representative papers from the alternative positions. For instance, the causation/laws of nature section focuses on whether these reduce or not, and the obvious 'reductionist' view here is a broadly Humean one (ably represented by Jonathan Schaffer), so the quite popular view that laws are relations between properties is left out, although both Schaffer and John Carroll criticize it as an unsatisfactory version of reductionism. The free will section reasonably pits compatibilism against incompatibilism -- but not surprisingly, the incompatibilist (Robert Kane) is mostly defending Libertarianism, so Hard Determinism is left out. And while both the mereology and metaontology sections present defenders of what might be called 'commonsense' along one dimension -- in the former, the view that composition is not unrestricted (Ned Markosian against James Van Cleve's universalism), and in the latter, that ontological disputes are 'real' and not merely verbal (Matti Eklund critiquing Eli Hirsch and various forms of ontological relativity) -- both views are somewhat unrepresentative tokens of their type; Markosian with his 'brute facts' of composition view, so we don't have the more familiar 'composition is restricted, and here is how', and Eklund himself expressing sympathy with a somewhat deflationary conception of ontology, in contrast with a more enthusiastic defense of the glories of enlightenment through metaphysical investigation, that might treat ontology as a species of science. All good stuff again -- just requiring some supplementation if new students are to get a proper lay of the land.

While there is no real need for there to be themes in a book of this sort, there are a few, and they can certainly provide some good material for an upper-level course. Some of these are highlighted by Ted Sider in his nice introduction, and I think they actually are suggested by the way in which the 'debate questions' are framed. One concerns the general issue of reduction, although in a number of cases (possible worlds, personal identity, free will), both sides favor reduction of some sort, but the terms differ. Some of the essays have nice explicit discussion of issues involved with taking terms as primitive, such as Joseph Melia on modality and Markosian. Another theme, similar but slightly at cross-currents, might be called 'the question of deflation'. In most of these disputes, at least one party is maintaining that there is 'less than meets the eye' to the phenomenon in question. Sometimes this takes the form of reduction -- but there are others. One form is Eliminativism, as in Cian Dorr's rejection of properties and other abstract objects. Sometimes deflation requires a certain kind of reduction. Compatibilism arguably deflates our prereflective thoughts about freedom, while incompatibilism, while it can also be reductive, does not (maybe it inflates it -- certainly realism about possible worlds, while reductive, is not deflationary!). Another sort of deflation occurs at a more theoretical level -- Markosian's 'brutal composition' view seems (to me?!) deflationary with respect to at least what philosophers expect from an account of composition, and of course, Hirsch's views are directly deflationary about ontology. These contrasts and others can be useful in thinking about 'philosophical architecture', and the book provides much to work with here.

As I say, most of the essays aren't aimed at providing powerful new arguments or defenses. However, some of them do attempt to break new ground. I'll conclude by mentioning a few of them here, with no prejudice at all intended towards the other essays, all of which make some interesting moves that are worthy of comment or query, but which are too numerous to all receive such treatment here. Cian Dorr's contribution, "There are No Abstract Objects," really is a legitimate journal article -- and rather more difficult than the other pieces. But it will, I think, generate discussion of a new style of nominalism. While others -- including Chris Swoyer in his defense of abstract entities -- often focus on the epistemic problems postulation of such entities raises, Dorr does not see the epistemic problems as any worse than the metaphysical ones. He offers the distinction between 'fundamental' and 'superficial' ways of talking, and suggests that most of the reasons people commit themselves to abstract objects come from taking superficial uses too seriously. (Dorr clearly thinks this distinction is important across metaphysics, and it is reminiscent of Chisholm's distinction between 'loose and popular' and 'strict and philosophical' speech, or Van Inwagen's talk 'in the philosophy room' and outside of it.) One of Dorr's most important arguments here occurs in a footnote (note 2), where he points out that the argument 'Either there is no planet or there is a planet; therefore, either the number of planets is zero or the number of planets is at least one' is as valid as other arguments with conclusions that seem to involve existential quantification over (or direct reference to) numbers and other abstract objects -- but surely, a valid argument with an analytic premise cannot establish any ontological conclusions. So if the argument is valid, the conclusion must be rather weaker than it seems -- rather than an ontological commitment to numbers, it is just a 'pleonastic' transformation allowed by the language. Another innovation Dorr offers comes in his paraphrases of seemingly committed abstract object talk -- a notorious problem. Dorr suggests that in general, we can prefix the problem claims with 'If there were (numbers, properties), and the material world were still as it is, then P'. (Here, he borrows from Yablo.) I must confess to not really understanding this -- not because the antecedent is, on the view in question, necessarily false, but because on the view, it is, I think, conceptually confused -- but if it is ok, it obviously generalizes. Dorr argues that we don't need abstract objects for explanatory purposes either in science or philosophy, but I wonder whether he doesn't make things a bit easier on himself by choosing numbers. I would think it easier to argue that science doesn't need numbers, than that it is not committed, say, to the property of having negative charge. Similarly, on the philosophical side, Dorr focuses, say, on the purported philosophical work done by the relation of instantiation. But one would have liked a little more focus on simpler 'data', such as that, say, objects a and b both have negative charge. Of course, we have that a has it, and b has it -- but the pronoun here has to be univocal. Items that are both F meet the same conditions, and resemblance is resemblance in certain respects. I'm sure Dorr has things to say here -- as these are more familiar motivations for abstracta, it might be good to see them addressed here. But he is frying somewhat bigger fish -- and indeed, it is the ambition of his esssay which has made me devote rather more time to it than perhaps one out of eighteen papers should get.

An interesting exploratory paper is John Hawthorne's "Three Dimensionalism vs. Four-Dimensionalism". More than defending three-dimensionalism, he tries to incisively lay out the overarching background views about space-time and its occupation by objects which are involved in four-dimensionalism, and then uses this -- negatively -- to characterize options for three-dimensionalists, culminating in an effort to articulate what may be meant in the three-dimensionalist's most familiar defining slogan, that objects are wholly present whenever they exist. For the 'tenser' three-dimensionalist, he explains why the 'picture' of a point moving along a time line seems more perspicuous than that of the line itself which is 'spread through' time. He then tries three ways of capturing the notion within a tenseless approach. He doesn't seem quite happy with any of them, but they are creative and worth further investigation. At any rate, these 'options' are only part of the interest of the paper -- the whole structure he sees in the dispute is engaging and insightful.

Phillip Bricker's "Concrete Possible Worlds" offers some unusual twists in response to familiar, but seemingly serious worries about the Lewis-inspired view. For instance, the 'isolation problem' arises from the Realist's need to explain what individuates possible worlds from each other -- what are their boundaries? This is of special importance to answer the question: Why aren't these other concrete places simply parts of the actual world? The familiar answer is: a world is a spatiotemporally and causally complete whole -- nothing from any world can interact causally with anything in another world. But this entails that no single world can have 'causally isolated' parts -- but this seems like it should be perfectly possible. Bricker's idea is to allow multiple worlds to be actual -- so the possibility entertained in the preceding sentence is one in which more than one world would be actual. Now, I'm not sure what this means. If we have two worlds here, how do we evaluate, say, 'all horses are black' with respect to this possible actuality, if in one world, all the horses are black, but not in the other? If we consider all the horses in both worlds, how are these two worlds? Worlds are supposed to be 'that with respect to which modal claims are evaluated'. Another innovation is Bricker's attempt to combine modal realism with a belief in absolute actuality -- "I, for one, could not endorse the thesis of a plurality of concrete worlds if I did not hold that there was a fundamental ontological distinction between the actual and the merely possible" (123-4). This doesn't really sound like something one would expect out of a realist's mouth. Bricker tries -- as others have (though mostly non-realists) -- to reconcile the indexicality of the word 'actual' with the absoluteness of the property it expresses. He suggests 'is actual' means 'belongs to the same fundamental ontological category as me'. This does allow 'is actual' to indexically pick out a categorical property -- but it seems antithetical to the modal realist picture to think that people in other worlds are ontologically different than we are: I thought the denial of that is precisely what distinguishes realists from their opponents. After all, one would think that if other worlds are just as concrete as ours, then people there are of all the exact same ontological categories as we. But perhaps Bricker's discussion of what it means to call other worlds 'concrete' (112-3) is meant to illustrate that realism needn't be as robust as it is normally taken to be. At any rate, Bricker's departures from Lewisian orthodoxy makes this essay an interesting read.

Some other intriguing ideas that I cannot go into here include John Carroll's suggestion that laws of nature differ from accidental regularities in that they obtain 'because of nature'; Robert Kane's attempt to explain how to use quantum indeterminacies to defend a more rigorous and explanatorily satisfying Libertarianism; Kadri Vihvelin's charge that the most popular incompatibilist arguments are inadequate because they don't favor incompatibilism over impossibilism -- the view that free action is a conceptual impossibility (one worries that it is a bit arbitrary not to consider impossibilism to be a particular version of incompatibilism, as opposed to a fully competing view); and Matti Eklund's seeming suggestion that a 'maximally decadent' ontology -- which he calls 'maximalism' -- can be seen as a form of deflationism (interesting, in that many who present themselves as 'non-deflationists' about ontology -- notably Ted Sider, and in this volume, Van Cleve -- are Universalists, which seems pretty close to maximalism in its realm).

As I say, the papers I have not explicitly discussed are all fine pieces of work as well -- and these are all especially good teaching papers, with clear exposition of most of the important arguments and/or replies. But they cannot all, alas, receive the treatment they deserve here. Let me conclude, then, by reiterating the quality of the papers produced for this volume, and saying again that it would make a fine textbook, and a useful resource for the professional philosopher.