Contemporary Debates in Moral Theory

Placeholder book cover

James Dreier (ed.), Contemporary Debates in Moral Theory, Blackwell, 2006, 331pp., ISBN 1405101792.

Reviewed by Sarah Stroud, McGill University


Contemporary Debates in Moral Theory offers up a series of lively debates on important points of contention in moral theory and meta-ethics.[1] Editor James Dreier and his contributors have produced a volume which is wide-ranging, useful, and interesting even to those already familiar with the debates covered in the book. This is not easy to do, for it is difficult to strike the right balance as a contributor to a book of this kind. On the one hand one should offer a perspicuous presentation of the debate or contested issue about which one has been asked to write: this inevitably involves drawing on and even summarizing already-existing literature. On the other hand, a book like this should not just be a digest or summary of controversies in the literature. Given that the commissioned authors are themselves distinguished contributors to those debates, one can reasonably hope that their chapters will offer novel arguments, or at least interesting recastings of the issues. Tilt too much in one direction and the volume becomes merely a secondary source or textbook. Tilt too much the other way and it becomes simply a collection of new journal articles. Neither is what is required.

On the whole this volume succeeds in striking the right balance. The quality of these essays, all written specially for this volume, is generally very high. Some are especially clear and engaging, and would be even to readers without a lot of background in the subject under discussion. For example, the essays on consequentialism by William Shaw and Alastair Norcross are both very accessible and helpful papers that I would be happy to assign to students in my class on contemporary moral theories. Moreover, quite a few of the papers manage both to lay out the contested terrain in a way that will be useful to students and to contribute something new to the discussion that even those familiar with the debate may not have seen. Peter Vallentyne, in his critique of consequentialism, not only helpfully discusses the different structural elements that make up a moral theory (and consequentialism in particular), but defends a particular substantive account of what grounds deontological constraints, a question on which anti-consequentialists are divided. Samuel Freeman stresses the way in which a contract approach reflects the fundamentally interpersonal character of morality. Peter Railton in his paper on moral factualism suggests we distinguish between the "dynamic" nature of moral judgment and its factual content: we could be motivational internalists about the attitude of judgment and motivational externalists about the content of judgments. (I return to some of the especially novel essays below.)

A few of the papers struck me as tired, or as not adding that much to what is already out there. Robert Audi has written several previous papers on generalism and particularism, and one might have hoped that this most recent one would advance beyond the earlier ones by engaging with what is presumably now the definitive book-length presentation and defense of moral particularism, Jonathan Dancy's Ethics Without Principles, which appeared in 2004 (early enough, one would think, to have been taken into account in a piece appearing in 2006). As indeed the Lance and Little paper in the present volume shows, the arguments over particularism have changed and advanced a lot since Dancy's original foray in his 1993 Moral Reasons, and even since the 2000 collection on which Audi relies heavily in his essay. So it would have been nice had his paper in this volume dealt with more recent literature on the topic. I also felt I detected a rather brisk and impatient tone in the papers by Rosalind Hursthouse and Simon Blackburn, as if they were tired of responding to what they view as the same old misguided objections, but were willing to go through the paces once more for this audience. (Blackburn also rather ill-advisedly included in his essay a response to a paper by Peacocke with which I'm sure the audience for this book won't be familiar.)

Although it is officially structured around particular contested issues, in fact the volume ends up presenting and covering most of the populated areas of logical space in contemporary moral theory and meta-ethics. For that reason it's interesting to see what's missing. In the moral theory portion, there is no section devoted to non-contract forms of deontology, which I would have thought were a prominent part of the literature. (Perhaps Dreier felt Vallentyne's piece adequately covered that strand of deontological thinking.) Neither of the essays on moral factualism so much as considers non-naturalist moral realism, despite the revival which such views have been mounting in recent years. Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons explicitly say that in the interest of brevity they will not discuss such views (237, n. 2), and Railton's description of what he calls "a rather minimal and catholic factualism" (205) seems however to exclude non-naturalist varieties of factualism. It is also noteworthy that in the section on moral judgment internalism, the two opponents -- Sigrún Svavarsdóttir and R. Jay Wallace -- both reject (classic) motivational internalism about moral judgment, leaving that important and influential position, rather surprisingly, absent from this volume. This means too that the disagreement between Svavarsdóttir and Wallace is more subtle, and as both authors refer frequently to their own previous work and to previous exchanges with their opposite number, I felt this section was less successful at drawing in readers not already well versed in the debates over internalism.

I'd like to describe in a little more detail three essays which I found particularly exciting or provocative, and which certainly advance the debate on their respective topics. Alastair Norcross proposes a moratorium on the endless debates over whether consequentialism offers the correct criterion of right action. For in fact, he says, consequentialism does not offer a criterion of right action at all. The question of what we are morally required to do, or what actions are right or wrong, is not the question which consequentialism is answering. Instead, consequentialism offers only a ranking of the moral value of actions. Consequentialism tells us that action A is morally better than action B, but it doesn't tell us to perform A rather than B. It doesn't itself tell us how far down the scale of goodness moral acceptability extends.

Norcross notes that understanding consequentialism in this way will allow the theory to escape many of the objections that have been raised against it. Of course it will generally be true that if you shrink the ambitions of a theory it will be subject to fewer objections, so this should come as no surprise. Offering a less ambitious theory also comes at a price, however: the theory may no longer be telling you what you feel you need to know. I think there are good reasons why the principal aspiration of moral theories has traditionally been to limn the basic deontic categories of the required, the forbidden, and the (merely) permissible. We don't just want to know if doing this would be better than doing that -- we often know that. We want to know if it would be OK to do the less good (but also less burdensome) thing. I think Norcross underestimates the cost of no longer being in the business of answering that question. Norcross, however, offers an interesting argument as to why a consequentialist in particular ought not to be in that business. On a consequentialist account, moral differences between actions are purely a function of the value of the consequences of those actions, which is a matter of (continuous) degree. So it risks being arbitrary to assert that at a certain point we are met with a difference in kind. According to Norcross, the consequentialist only plays into the hands of his deontological opponent if he is willing to make the distinction between right and wrong actions central to his ethics.

The proposal made in this chapter is not new (it has been developed in previous work by Norcross, and by Frances Howard-Snyder), but it is pressed here in a very forceful and engaging way. Of course, some deontologists might be delighted to hear a consequentialist admit that consequentialism is not well suited to offer an account of the difference between right and wrong actions.

Nick Zangwill contributes a rather odd, bracingly aggressive, but very stimulating piece to the debate on moral explanations. Zangwill focuses on one particular issue about explanation: what explains our moral judgments? As it turns out, he has no quarrel with most of the points that concern his ostensible sparring partner, Nicholas Sturgeon: he is happy to grant that moral facts are real, explanatory of various things in the world, and causally efficacious. He balks only at the idea that such facts explain moral beliefs.[2] His argument turns on a supposed conceptual feature of our moral judgments which he calls "the Because Constraint." It is a priori, Zangwill holds, that we can judge that something is M (for moral M) only because it is N. If S is bad, for instance, she must be bad because she is F, G, or H; and if we judge that S is bad it must be that we judge S to be bad because she is P, Q, or R.

Zangwill wobbles a bit on what can be put in for F, G, H, P, Q, and R in these schemas. To say "we must think that Billy is bad because or in virtue of the way he is in other respects" (270) places few restrictions on what properties can play those roles. But on the next page Zangwill summarizes by saying (what is not at all equivalent) that "we judge not that something is bad period, but that it is bad because of certain natural properties" (271, emphasis added). This wobble matters, because I think the plausibility of viewing the Because Constraint as "an everyday, common sense commitment of folk morality" (273) is importantly affected by whether we take the broad or the narrower reading of the constraint. Zangwill's own choice of illustration of the doctrine is "if I judge that Isabella was bad in 1492, I must judge that she was bad in virtue of bigotry, intolerance, torture, or whatever" (270). But as Sturgeon acutely points out in his contribution (250 f.; 259, n. 20), it is not at all clear that these "base" properties are (or need be) non-moral, or natural.

Zangwill's essay weaves its way from the Because Constraint through moral supervenience and some related theses to an epistemological conclusion: "moral judgments, if they are beliefs, are a priori" (278). The path to this conclusion is rather tortuous, and I'm sure I did not completely follow all the connections Zangwill wanted to draw out. But this was an extremely original and interesting paper, and Zangwill's argument (273-6) that there is an important epistemological difference between moral properties and natural kinds seems to me an intriguing addition to the debates over ethical naturalism. Unfortunately, Zangwill's essay was marred by (what I found to be) shockingly aggressive rhetoric about other philosophers. Zangwill calls Ronald Dworkin an "Obscurantist Ostrich philosopher" (277), and he swiftly dismisses the view of the so-called "English Perceptual School" (read McDowell) as "extraordinarily implausible" (279, n. 13). On that view, says Zangwill, moral thinking uncannily resembles Nancy Mitford's distinction between "U" and "non-U": "what masquerades as the perception of important subtle nuances is in fact a system of baseless distinctions" (279, n. 13). These kinds of indecorous charges only distract attention from the interesting arguments Zangwill has to offer.

Finally, Mark Lance and Margaret Little contribute an exciting chapter which advances the debate over moral particularism. Their main target is the concern that moral particularism violates certain general views about explanation which ought to hold even in the moral domain. Lance and Little argue, by contrast, that a particularist perspective makes possible an especially rich type of explanation which enhances our understanding in ways not available to more traditional conceptions of explanation. In other words, they take what has been regarded as a principal weakness of particularism and argue that it is in fact a notable strength.

Particularists are fond of citing apparent exceptions even to prima facie moral principles. Considerations commonly held to be morally relevant can "switch valence" depending on context. On a traditional conception of explanation, however, only valence-invariant factors can appear in genuine explanations. If we wish to hold on to the idea that it is possible to explain why a given action was wrong, then we must resist the purported phenomenon of valence-switching -- or find some valence-invariant factors, anyway, to use in explanations. Particularists sometimes give the impression that they do not much wish to hold on to that idea. Lance and Little, however, do. Moreover, they want to secure an explanatory role for the kinds of concrete considerations that are ordinarily taken to be morally relevant, such as lying and promise-keeping. They are not satisfied with the suggestion that "thick" ethical concepts such as honesty and fidelity can play an explanatory role, since at least they do not exhibit valence-switching. Such a view (they cite Roger Crisp, but by implication their complaint extends to Jonathan Dancy) can allow that ordinary features such as lying are part of the moral mosaic in a particular case, but to say this is not to confer on such features a genuine explanatory role. For granting that status requires a commitment to generality which this view is not willing to extend to factors like these. The "pure discernment" theory is, in short, too particularist for Lance and Little.[3]

Lance and Little think we can preserve the explanatory role of "familiar moral concepts" (308) while accepting that these factors valence-switch. To do so we will have to move to a different conception of what is required in order to explain something. Lance and Little argue that explanations of the wrongness of an act which cite familiar factors such as lying appeal to what they call "defeasible generalizations": generalities which can be revelatory of the nature of a thing even while admitting of exceptions. That lying figures in such defeasible generalizations gives it a different status than factors which may have been wrong-making in a particular case, but which are not part of any explanation. Lance and Little's general discussion of defeasible generalizations and of the conception of lawlikeness associated with them draws heavily on the work of Marc Lange and other philosophers of science, and is pretty heavy going for the moral-philosophy reader. I am not fully convinced that their alternative model of explanation and generality has been developed with sufficient clarity to demonstrate -- as they wish to -- that particularists can indeed deliver up robust explanations of the moral status of actions. But this essay significantly advances the debate, and represents an exciting new avenue of particularist thought -- one which implicitly repudiates the still-dominant strand in particularism which seems to shun the generality Lance and Little seek to incorporate into the theory.

I close with some quibbles. Besides ardently wishing the editor could have persuaded Zangwill to tone down his expressions of disdain for other philosophers, I also would have liked to see a heavier editorial hand in some other respects. Typos and the like crop up throughout the volume (the Sturgeon-Zangwill section seems to have more than its fair share), and the references, in particular, are sprinkled with errors which should have been caught. I noticed errors of various sorts in the references at 196, 216, 218, 237, 304, 306, 320, and 321. Mistakes like these are irritating, and especially regrettable in a book of this nature on which students may be relying for suggestions for further reading. On the same subject, I wondered about the provenance of the lists of Further Reading appended to some of the essays. Were they proposed by the author of the piece immediately subsequent to which they appear, or by the editor? Are they supposed to pertain to the specific article which they follow, or to the whole issue under debate in that section? It would have been useful for the editor to have clarified what exactly these are.

Nonetheless, Dreier and his contributors are to be warmly commended for a high-quality volume which will be useful both to students and to those hoping to find fresh perspectives on some of the leading controversies in contemporary ethics and meta-ethics.

[1] In fact, if we mean by "moral theory" the theoretical, systematic branch of normative ethics, only seven of the seventeen essays in this volume are in moral theory as opposed to meta-ethics. But I don't think there is a received word for that part of moral philosophy which includes moral theory and meta-ethics but excludes applied ethics, so it's hard to think of a better title for the volume.

[2] As Sturgeon notes, this "seems a difficult position to defend. If Hitler's depravity could shape world historical events, as Zangwill grants, it seems odd to think that it couldn't play any causal role in producing what is, by comparison, a much smaller effect, my coming to think Hitler depraved" (253).

[3] They also make the memorable charge that such a view "requires a huge wallop of Aristotelian mojo" (309).