Contemporary Dualism: A Defense

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Andrea Lavazza and Howard Robinson (eds.), Contemporary Dualism: A Defense, Routledge, 2014, 292pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415818827.

Reviewed by Lynne Rudder Baker, University of Massachusetts Amherst


This is a brave book. Dualism, the editors tell us, "has a bad reputation," and the editors seek to revive mind-body dualism as a "progressive research programme." (Introduction 7, 5) Despite its "bad reputation" among mainstream philosophers today, dualism retains a vibrancy that this book manifests.

With fourteen different papers (including the introduction), the absence of a single specific thesis of dualism is not surprising. With some exceptions (e.g., Martina Fürst, 130, n.1), the authors seem to think that we all know what physicalism or materialism is, and they have various conceptions of what physicalism or materialism (allegedly) cannot explain. The collection is divided into four sections: The Limits of Materialism (Uwe Meixner, Andrea Lavazza, David Lund); Dualism and Empirical Research (Riccardo Manzotti and Paolo Moderato, Henry Stapp, Fürst); Cartesian (Substance) Dualism (Richard Swinburne, Howard Robinson, Ralph Walker); Non-Cartesian Dualism (Charles Taliaferro, William Hasker, David Skrbina, E. J. Lowe).

Many of the papers have novel and thought-provoking claims and arguments. I shall discuss three at some length, and then the others more briefly.

(I) One of the most intriguing papers is "Neuroscience: Dualism in Disguise" by Riccardo Manzotti and Paolo Moderato.They argue that neuroscientists implicitly accept a view that they explicitly reject: dualism. They mention two assumptions of neuroscience (85):

1. The mind is physical. (dualism rejected)

2. The part of the physical world that is sufficient for the mind is the brain (or some suitable proper part of the central nervous system -- CNS. (Neural Chauvinism)

Every known neural process may occur in the absence of conscious experience. (88) And even if we had a neural correlate for consciousness in general, we still would not know why a specific physical process leads to the occurrence of a specific phenomenal experience. (88) From the beginning of modern science at the time of Galileo, phenomenal properties of consciousness were separated from quantitative qualities and expunged from the description of nature. (89) So, neuroscience "cannot tackle consciousness because the essential properties of the mind have been programmatically and selectively set aside from the physical world." (89)

Some scientists turn to postulating some intermediate thing-like entity that is not exactly a physical thing but "has some allure of scientific respectability like information, coding, computation, maps, representations, and symbols." (91) However, postulation of such entities is ontologically empty: it "does not add anything to the causal description of the world." (92) The authors say: "Consciousness is a real phenomenon. It needs to be grounded on ontologically real entities not just on epistemic entities." (92-93) They argue that the grounding "entities" are just epistemic fictions, "ontological promissory notes," that are never redeemed. (92) In the absence of physicalist redemption, "ontological promissory notes" offer a dualistic picture of the mind-body problem. Along the way, Manzotti and Moderato discuss a number of philosophers and neuroscientists: Descartes, Ronald Melzack, John-Dylan Haynes, Patrick Haggard, Kendrick Kay, Thomas Nasclaris, Jack Gallant, and Alva Noë.

A skeletal version of the argument for dualism, as I understand it, goes like this: consciousness is a real phenomenon that requires a real physical basis assumed to be in the CNS; but no physical basis is found in the CNS, so an intermediate thing-like entity (symbols, information, etc.) is postulated by scientists. But the intermediate entity is only an epistemic entity that makes no difference in the physical world and hence cannot provide the physical basis of consciousness. Manzotti and Moderato conclude that there are only two options for neuroscience: reject the assumption that "the physical basis of the conscious mind has to be internal to the CNS" or explicitly accept dualism. (97)

Although their argument ends with the disjunction -- either CNS or dualism -- what Manzotti and Moderato really want to argue for is dualism. Dualism follows only with the addition of nontrivial assumptions: that there is no physical basis at all (internal or external to the CNS), and that consciousness is a real phenomenon. The skeletal version, as I would amend it, is this:

    1. Consciousness is a real phenomenon. (empirical premise)

    2. If consciousness is a real phenomenon and dualism is false, then consciousness has a physical basis. (conceptual truth, given physicalism)

    3. Consciousness has no physical basis (either internal or external to the CNS). (empirical investigation)

∴ 4. Either consciousness is not a real phenomenon or dualism is true. (2,3 MT)

∴ 5. Dualism is true. (1,4 DS)

This argument is valid. Even so, its soundness may be questioned: one may, with Dennett, reject premise one that consciousness is a real phenomenon. (Rejecting premise one seems eminently implausible to me, but not to many physicalists.) Or, more plausibly I think, one may reject premise two, and hold instead that consciousness is real and dualism is false, and yet consciousness has no physical basis. (Taking a physical basis to be some specific physical configuration, I would reject premise two.) I do not know whether Manzotti and Moderato would accept my version of their argument, but it has the merit of being formally valid, and perhaps sound.

(II) Another thought-provoking paper is Henry P. Stapp's "Quantum Theory of Mind." Stapp is a quantum physicist at Berkeley. He argues that orthodox quantum mechanics as formulated by Von Neumann in 1932 should be interpreted as describing causal connections "between our minds and their associated quantum physically-described brains." (102) The theory can be consistently interpreted as describing a reality that has "physical and mental aspects, with the mental aspects not determined by the physical ones." (102)

The uninformed reader (as I am) would benefit from further explanation. For example, Stapp says that free choices are logically required by the theory "in order to break a symmetry and allow our perceptions to have the character that they actually possess, rather than being continuous smears of possible experiences of the kind that actually populate our streams of consciousness." (102) I would like to know what kind of symmetry free choices break, and how these undetermined free choices accomplish the symmetry-breaking.

Stapp says that quantum theory concerns "empirically validated connections between the quantum mechanical description of atoms and certain happenings in our streams of conscious experience." (99) Stapp uses this to show how quantum mechanics requires "action-at-a-distance," which is inconsistent with classical mechanics. He also has a fascinating argument against interpreting Benjamin Libet's famous experiments as showing that the brain is in control of our bodily motions and that our decisions to move are merely side effects of what the brain has already done. (109-111) I found this discussion very useful.

Let me conclude with some questions about Stapp's notion of "free choice" or "free will". Is the idea of "free choice" really the best interpretation of the mathematical formalism? Would interpreting the formalism as "random event" work just as well? Is "free choice" as used in the interpretation of quantum mechanics the same phenomenon as "free will" used by libertarians? (I ask this because "free choice" is exercised in a highly specific and constrained setting in Stapp's interpretation of quantum mechanics -- hardly in the broad way that libertarians take to be a requirement of moral responsibility.) These questions leave me wondering about the extent to which Stapp's view of quantum mechanics really supports dualism.

(III) One of the most intriguing papers in the collection is E. J. Lowe's "Why My Body Is Not Me: The Unity Argument for Emergent Self-Body Dualism." Taking a self or person (he uses the terms interchangeably) to be a self-reflecting subject of thought, Lowe asks, what is the fundamental ontological category of a self or person?

After arguing that thoughts are partly individuated (248) by their subjects, Lowe sets out what he calls "the unity argument," the conclusion of which is this: "all and only my thoughts have just one thing, me, as their unique subject. Furthermore . . . all of these thoughts depend upon me for their very existence." (251) So, "all and only my thoughts depend upon me for their very existence." (252) So, we now have a crucial test for something's being identical with me: X is identical with me if and only if X is "such that all of my thoughts depend upon it and, indeed, that no thought of mine depends [on anything not identical with X]." (259)

Lowe came up with a general argument to show that no bodily thing -- neither entire animal, nor brain, nor part of a brain, nor system (like the CNS), nor part of a system -- can be identical with me. The reason is that the way that thoughts depend on, say, the brain is different from the way that they depend on me. My "thoughts depend in a distributive fashion on various different and overlapping parts of my brain," but this is not the way that they depend on me, their subject. "Rather, they all depend collectively on me, such that were I to cease to exist, then so would they -- each and every one of them." (260) This structural difference between the way that my thoughts depend on my brain (or any other bodily thing) and the way that they depend on me guarantees that no bodily thing can be identical with me. So, what fundamentally am I? "I am just a self or person -- a subject of thought and agent of actions." (260) In this case, we seem to have self or person as a basic ontological category. But then Lowe goes on to argue, from the fact that persons are distinct from and irreducible to bodies and bodily systems, to dualism of person and body. (261)

Lowe makes his dualism as palatable as possible to nondualists: he leaves it open whether "mental properties can only be exemplified at all if they are co-exemplified with suitable physical properties" and he acknowledges strong arguments for the causal autonomy of selves or persons. (261) However, Lowe's argument, as clever as it is, does not lead to dualism without a further assumption -- namely that distinctness of person and body suffices for dualism. If you think that there is a relevant kind of unity other than identity, you may applaud Lowe up until he opts for dualism of self or person and body.

Now I shall try to suggest, all-too-briefly, the flavors of the other papers in the volume and point to aspects that struck me as notable.

(1) Martina Fürst, in "A Dualist Account of Phenomenal Concepts," is very well-versed in the relevant literature of arguments concerning physicalism that are based on the phenomenal character of consciousness, and she is a careful writer. Focusing on Jackson's well-known "knowledge argument," Fürst gives a fine survey of physicalists' efforts to explain away anti-physicalist conclusions; then she gives an account of the formation and cognitive role of phenomenal concepts; and finally, she argues that phenomenal concepts "have the explanatory power to imply non-physical referents." (121) Fürst's own account of phenomenal concepts is similar to the physicalists' up to a point, but is crucially different in a way that becomes a clever argument against physicalism. The article is noteworthy for its clarity and argumentative detail.

(2) Andrea Lavazza's argument in "Problems of Physicalism Regarding the Mind," although difficult, points out the implications for physicalism of the tension between the necessity of logical laws and the contingency of the way that the human brain is wired. The argument -- involving discussions of Davidson, Kant and Kripke -- is quite complex. If logical laws are necessary, the conclusion, as I understand it, is that "we must admit the existence of some type of Fregean Platonism, which is incompatible with strong physicalism." (49) If I am anywhere near the mark, Lavazza's argument is new to the literature.

(3) In "Materialism, Dualism, and the Conscious Self," David Lund sees occurrent consciousness to be the obstacle to nondualism. He surveys several forms of materialism and finds them all lacking (as do I). He goes on to say:

Given the constraints of the materialist framework, what such terms as awareness or consciousness may seem to pick out must in the end be seen either as a linguistically generated illusion, and thus eliminable, or as reducible to behavioral dispositions perhaps in conjunction with states of the non-dispositional base (i.e., brain states). (67)

Like Lund, I think (and have argued extensively) that consciousness experience is neither reducible nor eliminable; nevertheless, I think that his statement in the previous paragraph falters on a narrow conception of materialism. Why can't occurrent consciousness simply have evolved slowly over many species, ending with us? If our world came to be inhabited by conscious beings by natural evolution, why couldn't we be material things? After all, dogs are subjects of conscious experiences, and dogs are material things, aren't they?

(4) Uwe Meixner's "Against Physicalism" takes physicalism to be the thesis that "Every non-abstract individual is completely physical" (17), where physicalism is taken to be the token-identity theory. (19) Unlike some physicalists and non-physicalists alike, Meixner explicitly rejects the construal of physicalism in terms of dependence of the mental on the physical (or supervenience). Meixner has a battery of arguments against our being completely physical. (Interestingly, the token-identity theory plays no role in Meixner's arguments.) Agreeing that properties are abstract entities, I wonder: does having properties essentially make an otherwise physical object "not completely physical"? In particular, if I am made up wholly of physical particles, but I have certain properties essentially (roughly, my view), am I not completely physical? I'd like to know more.

(5) Richard Swinburne's paper defending substance dualism has an intriguing title, "What Makes Me Me?" and I wish more philosophers would ask and answer this question. Swinburne's answer to the question is that my soul, which has its own thisness, is different from the thisness of anything else. We persons, says Swinburne, are pure mental substances, who can "exist logically independently of physical substances." (150) A point on which I think that Swinburne is right is this: what makes me me is not any of my qualitative properties -- not my mental life, and not my bodily life.

(6) Howard Robinson in "Naturalism and the Unavoidability of the Cartesian Perspective" quotes Dennett on the unavoidability of the intentional stance. Robinson takes the inevitability of the intentional stance to be the inevitability of the Cartesian perspective on oneself, the unavoidability of the thought, "I think therefore I am." (156) Then he argues that this Cartesian perspective is not consistent with "physicalism and any kind of naturalism." In addition to discussing Dennett, Robinson discusses, at least briefly, an interesting array of contemporary philosophers: Kim, Barry Loewer, Fodor, Davidson, Quine; then, at greater length, McDowell, Price, Rorty. However, along the way the focus changes from the Cartesian point of view, which is first-personal, to the point of view of the special sciences and "the human level" (which is third-personal). (168) Since the special sciences are formulated in the third person, there seems to be an interesting and important slide in the argument.

(7) In "On What We Must Think," Ralph C.S. Walker starts with the Kantian view that "rational beings must . . . think of themselves as capable of being moved by reason itself, and not always as reacting to causal forces." (Walker 172) Walker argues that we must think of ourselves as able to respond to the demands of reason, and that, if so, we need not take seriously the mere logical possibility that we are under an illusion. (179) This, he says, establishes that we are "indeed capable of thinking and acting in response to our awareness of rational principles, and that therefore there is something importantly nonphysical about our minds." (173)

Walker goes on to argue further that the mind is a non-physical substance, as Descartes argued. Indeed, we must think of ourselves as subjects of experience, as persisting (immaterial) selves. This is too hasty. Although I lack room for an argument here, let me say just this: to be committed to think of oneself, as Walker holds, "as a subject that thinks" or as being "able to think and act in response to reason" (187) does not commit one to think of oneself as non-physical.

(8) In "The Promise and Sensibility of Integrative Dualism" by Charles Taliaferro tries to meet three challenges of physicalists: (i) their belief in the primacy of the physical and the third-person point of view; (ii) their belief that dualism involves a radical bifurcation; and (iii) their charge that there can be no dualist causal interaction. Taliaferro argues for the primacy of the mental (against (i)), the functional unity of the embodied person (against (ii)), and a recommendation to reverse standard approaches to mental-physical interaction by beginning with the mental (against (iii)).

One intriguing theme of dualists, including Taliaferro, is that, without dualism, a person -- in particular a neuroscientist -- cannot understand her own actions when she is conducting research on the brain. On my view, the problem of understanding what one is doing is solved by reference to the robust first-person perspective without reference to two kinds of entities at all.

(9) In "The Dialectic of Soul and Body," William Hasker looks first to Thomas Aquinas and then to J. P. Moreland for accounts of the soul-body relation. Both are ultimately found wanting. Hasker presents his own view of emergent dualism, according to which the soul develops "naturally from the structure and functioning of the organism." (215) His view escapes the difficulties in Aquinas's and Moreland's accounts. In particular, it does not court vitalism, nor does it "posit immutable natural kinds of living creatures." Hasker's view thus has the virtue of being ready to be "incorporated into an evolutionary story." (216) The dialectic of soul and body is neatly developed.

(10) David Skrbina, in "Dualism, Dual-Aspectism, and the Mind," urges us to do justice to the ideas of both mind and body, ideas that he says have been in play since the Egyptians around 2350 BCE. Skrbina proposes what he calls "dual-aspectism" that describes a monist reality in terms of two distinct aspects, mental and physical, that have equal standing. (228)

Skrbina takes it that there is "the mind-body problem," (my emphasis) to be found throughout the history of philosophy. He finds variations on the theme of dual-aspectism in the thought of many figures, almost all of whom were "panpsychists or at least strongly sympathetic to it." (238) He suggests that panpsychism "may be our best hope for resolving some of our most-long standing philosophical problems." (238) However, when Skrbina presents his version of dual-aspectism, the panpsychism fades into parallelism. He takes "matter-mind as the monistic reality," in which there is a "one-to-one matching of all physical states and all mental states." (239) However, since parallelism is compatible with occasionalism, but panpsychism is not, parallelism and panpsychism are not compatible positions. Or so it would seem.

To conclude, overall these papers exhibit a forceful battery of arguments for various kinds of dualism. Some of the papers here are not as clearly or succinctly written as they should be. (I found the Introduction difficult to follow.) Some papers are repetitious. Other papers, however, e.g., Meixner's, are clear and straightforward, and therefore, easy (even exciting) to contend with. In the current intellectual climate, where physicalism and naturalism hold sway, it is useful to have a volume that surveys a number of contemporary dualistic positions, and this book is a good start.