Contemporary Philosophical Naturalism and Its Implications

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Bana Bashour and Hans D. Muller (eds), Contemporary Philosophical Naturalism and Its Implications, Routledge, 2014, 199pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415813099.

Reviewed by Carl B. Sachs, Georgetown University


As has been frequently remarked, "naturalism" is a banner under which numerous armies march. Though it is useful to consider the varieties of naturalism, the present volume instead examines a specific issue: does Darwin's conceptual/empirical revolution eliminate teleology and intentionality, or does it explain teleology and intentionality? How, too, should we think about the continuity and discontinuity between living and non-living things, and between sapient animals -- paradigmatically, normal mature human beings -- and non-sapient animals? Thus the collection is somewhat narrower than the range of contested views under 'naturalism'; instead the focus lies -- as the introduction, "Exploring the Post-Darwinian Naturalist Landscape" makes clear -- on what might be said about purpose, conceptuality, meaning, rationality, and ethics in light of Darwinian naturalism.[1]

The first section, "Metaphysics Naturalized?", consists of two essays, by Alex Rosenberg and by Paul Horwich, that mark the boundaries of contemporary philosophical naturalism. Whereas Rosenberg ("Disenchanted Naturalism") stakes out a radical and nihilistic naturalism, Horwich ("Naturalism and the Linguistic Turn") defends a minimal naturalism -- so minimal that anything more anodyne could not count as naturalism in any sense. According to Rosenberg, naturalism is "the label for the thesis that the tools we should use in answering philosophical problems are the methods and findings of the mature sciences -- from physics across to biology and increasingly neuroscience" (p. 17), from which it follows that the only answer to the question, 'what is the world really like?' is

fermions and bosons and everything that can made up of them and nothing that can't be made up of them. . . . all the other facts -- the chemical, biological, psychological, social, economic, political, cultural facts -- supervene on the physical facts and are ultimately explained by them. (p. 19)

Not only did Newton dispense with final causes in physics, but Darwin did the same in biology. Purposes and intention are cognitive illusions produced by brains that are not very good at accurately modeling reality because our brains crave stories with plots, and the fundamental laws of physics are not stories with plots. The traditional philosophical questions -- is there purpose in nature? Is there a meaning to life? Is there a rational ground to morality? Is there original intentionality? -- all have one answer: 'no'. (The last of these questions is of particular importance for understanding Rosenberg's view, and his defense of teleosemantics (pp. 25-27) has much to recommend it, though Muller's criticism later in the volume are insightful.) However, Rosenberg concludes by noting that "the question remains whether a radical eliminativism about intentionality has to get along without truth or falsity altogether" (p. 36), which in turn raises the question as to what would happen to Rosenberg's own commitment to the truth of scientific theories once original intentionality is eliminated.

By contrast, Horwich distinguishes between anti-supernaturalism ("Within the domain of phenomena that bear spatial, temporal, causal, and explanatory relations to one another, science rules" (p. 38)) and a stronger view, 'metaphysical naturalism', which takes the further step that this domain is all that there is. Whereas anti-supernaturalism sets the bar so low that rather few would, I suggest, think to contend against it, Horwich argues that any attempt to raise the bar must contend with the existence of non-natural facts -- mathematical facts, conceptual facts, ethical facts, and modal facts. These facts are, in Horwich's terms, "data -- epistemologically basic convictions" (p. 39) that, however explained, must not be merely 'explained away,' as metaphysical naturalism does. (However, the sophisticated metaphysical naturalist will want an argument as to why these "epistemologically basic convictions" are any less defeasible than our pre-Copernican intuitions about solar movement.) Horwich then concludes by situating his reservations about metaphysical naturalism in the context of his Wittgensteinian reservations about metaphysics per se.

The next section, "Reasons Naturalized," consists of essays by Daniel Dennett ("The Evolution of Reasons") and by Ruth Garrett Millikan ("The Tangle of Natural Purposes That Is Us"), which show that there are indeed viae mediae between Rosenberg's nihilistic naturalism and Horwich's anodyne anti-supernaturalism, in both cases by showing how to make sense of traditionally 'teleological' language in terms more clearly connected with the empirical results of natural sciences. Dennett's key move here is to show how the intentional stance, precisely because it is an epistemological device with no ontological purport, applies just as well to organisms "designed by Mother Nature" as it does to the artifacts crafted by intelligent agents. With this move in place, Dennett can proceed to clarify the role of reasons or purposes in nature in terms of the distinction between "what for?" and "how come?" types of "why?" questions, and then in terms of the distinction between reasons and reason-representers. Lots of organisms, it turns out, do things for reasons, but only we are able to represent them (and ourselves) as having the reasons that they do. This is necessary because, on Dennett's view, "you can't do biology without assuming function, and you can't assume function without seeing reasons everywhere" (p. 62). However, Dennett holds, we can see reasons everywhere without returning to an Aristotelian, teleological metaphysics (and without offering aid and comfort to the Intelligent Design movement) because the intentional stance is just as anti-realist (or non-realist) for biological functions as it is for beliefs and desires of agents.

Millikan, by contrast, is less concerned with the epistemological/ontological distinction and more committed to figuring out how purpose-having can be explained without importing final causation into the basic ontology. On her account, the important thing is being able to possess certain kinds of representations -- what she calls 'pushmi-pullyu' representations -- that are both declarative and directive at once, especially with regard to perceptual representations. Aims are "representational vehicles -- not descriptive ones, of course, but directive ones" (p. 69), so that we can understand the emergence of aims and purposes in nature in terms of the emergence of directive representations -- representations that have the natural purposes (due to past natural selection) of actualizing what they represent, such that our conscious purposes are "the purposes of the representations that represent these purposes" (p. 69). Much like Dennett, Millikan aims to show that talk of purposes is acceptable by naturalists; accepting naturalism neither requires, contra Rosenberg, claiming that purposes are a cognitive illusion, nor requires, contra Horwich, no more than an anodyne anti-supernaturalism.

The remaining essays pursue 'the naturalization project' with regard to conceptual thought, knowledge, kinds, intentionality, and ethics. By 'the naturalization project' I mean that the explanations should satisfy two desiderata: that the explanation show that some complicated phenomena manifestly available to self-understanding can be understood in terms of simpler phenomena, and that the account of both the simpler phenomena and the process of construction or emergence is grounded in the empirical (natural and social) sciences. Hence the explanations are, to use a well-worked metaphor, 'bottom-up' rather than 'top-down'. I shall briefly turn to each of these naturalization projects before concluding the review.

Ellen Fridland ("Skill Learning and Conceptual Thought") argues that the debate between those who emphasize skills and those who emphasize conceptual thought is misleadingly drawn because it overlooks what makes skills different from other kinds of abilities. Rather, "we should look both to the continuity and discontinuity between human and nonhuman animal intelligence in action" (p. 77). With the right distinctions in place, and drawing on Annette Karmiloff-Smith's representational redescription theory of cognitive development, Fridland argues that we can make sense of how conceptual thought emerges, in distinct stages, from abilities and skills. Though her essay leaves some important questions open, it promises to re-orient the entire discussion about continuity and discontinuity between sapient and non-sapient minds. Her work here also gestures towards yet another avenue whereby classical American pragmatism can again be made relevant to contemporary debates, though Fridland does not explore this option.

Ray Brassier's outstanding and comprehensive exposition of Wilfrid Sellars's naturalistic and materialistic ontology ("Nominalism, Naturalism, and Materialism") shows us how to reconcile the thought that "reality does not have propositional form" (p. 101) with the propositional form of our knowledge. Central to this is Sellars's rejection of the Myth of the Given, his insistence that sensations are intensional but not intentional, and his distinction between 'signifying' and 'picturing,' where the picturing items are representations that stand in causal relations with the objects named. Together with the argument for the dispensability of predicates and the metalinguistic treatment of kind-talk, the theory of picturing shows how the propositional form of thought and talk is causally related to the non-propositional form of reality. The result is a naturalism that is "critical rather than dogmatic precisely insofar as it retains a role for a priori philosophical theorizing" (p. 112) but in which metaphysical theorizing is constrained by empirical inquiry.

In "Naturalizing Kinds," Muhammad Ali Khalidi considers how talk about natural kinds might be consistent with the explanatory resources and requirements of the natural sciences, in contrast with essentialism about natural kinds. Khalidi builds his account through critical engagement with Mill, Quine, John Dupré, and Richard Boyd. On the positive account, "natural kinds correspond to the categories posited by our best scientific theories" (p. 132). Put otherwise, it suggests that we think of natural kinds as being the joints in nature that our theories ought to carve. This is not a matter of letting epistemology drive metaphysics, Khalidi urges, but a matter of explicating the realism implicit in privileging epistemic purposes over non-epistemic purposes, although it is the satisfaction of epistemic desiderata which shows that the natural kinds posited by science have a greater claim to carve nature at its joints than other kinds of categories (e.g., Dupré's "folk categories").

Turning from the metaphysics and epistemology of evolutionary naturalism to what evolutionary naturalism entails about human beings, "The Human Mind Naturalized" contains three essays about the continuity and discontinuity between humans and other animals. Tim Crane ("Human Uniqueness and the Pursuit of Knowledge") defends the view that there is at least one major discontinuity between human beings and non-human animals -- that human beings value knowledge for its own sake. Crane appeals to Davidson's epistemology and to comparative cognitive psychology (especially with chimpanzees and children) to show that language plays a crucial role in allowing us to represent ourselves and others as being in error, and that non-lingual animals do not have this ability -- in particular, that chimps can represent conspecifics as being ignorant but not as being mistaken. There is a deep conceptual tie between being able to attribute errors to others and valuing knowledge for its own sake, and on Crane's view, this marks a human uniqueness with deep ontogenetic roots. What is crucial to Crane is not that naturalism favors continuity over discontinuity, but that the discontinuity itself be naturalistically explained.

Much like Fridland, Hans Muller ("Naturalism and Intentionality") observes that the program of giving a naturalistic reconstruction of a target phenomenon -- in this case, intentionality -- becomes far more tractable if we avoid committing ourselves to an overly rich, demanding conception of the target in question. We would do better in naturalizing intentionality by distinguishing between different kinds of intentionality. Here Muller uses recent work by Tamar Gendler, Suzanne Cunnignham, and me to distinguish between a low-grade kind of intentionality more amenable to explanation in terms of the natural sciences and the high-grade kind of intentionality that has dominated discussion of intentionality since Brentano. All three theorists have proposed some account of non-propositional intentionality as more basic than propositional intentionality, and which is more easily explained in naturalistic terms than its propositional descendent. Doing so stands a far better chance of advancing the discussion than does the usual approach of "telling teleo-evolutionary stories about the appropriateness of a brain structure to a given environment to try to fix the semantic content of propositional attitudes" (p. 180). We should refrain from attempting to naturalize high-grade intentionality, notice that high-grade intentionality is oddly recalcitrant to naturalization, and conclude either that intentionality is an illusion (Rosenberg) or that Darwinian naturalism cannot account for it (Fodor).

Finally, Bana Bashour's "Can I Be a Good Animal?" takes up the question of naturalized ethics through a different approach to virtue ethics. Bashour follows Anscombe in holding that "the categorical imperative and the principle of utility are relics of our outdated religious world-view" (p. 183) and that one ought to adopt virtue ethics in response. But virtue ethicists have tended to rely on a problematic philosophy of psychology that treats virtues as dispositions. Instead she uses Dennett's intentional stance by treating virtues as states of character attributed to agents in order to predict and explain their behavior. This approach avoids circularity in defining what a virtue is and explains why one should aspire to virtue: to avoid massive irrationality in one's character-traits (p. 186). Bashour concludes by directly challenging Rosenberg's 'nice nihilism': "we need not be felt as disenchanted as Alex Rosenberg with what naturalism brings to our attention. We simply need to reshape the philosophical landscape to make it fit better with this new revolution and more accurate worldview" (p. 192).

I would like to consider a metaphilosophical issue, using Sellars to bring it into focus. "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man" made famous the distinction between "the manifest image" and "the scientific image".[2] The manifest image consists of the basic categories we have of ourselves as persons able to perceive, think, and act. By contrast, the scientific image -- the to-be-achieved unification of sociology and psychology with biology, chemistry and physics -- shows us that the basic objects posited by our best scientific theories are collections of particles, not persons. Yet neither image, Sellars insisted, has absolute priority; the regulative ideal of philosophy, Sellars argued, consisted in arriving at a 'stereoscopic fusion' of the two images.

But how is this best pursued? At one extreme, one treats the scientific image as a Procrustean bed by lopping off of the manifest image whatever cannot be explained by current natural science. At the other extreme, one merely avoids positing supernatural entities while explicating the manifest image on its own terms. The first yields nihilism by simply eliminating intentionality and agency in order to accommodate the scientific image, whereas the second undermines the transcendental realism implicit in scientific inquiry in order to preserve the self-understanding to which we have become accustomed. Both extremes are not only simplistic but also pessimistic. The more arduous route is to engage in the hard work of figuring out precisely which aspects of the manifest image can be naturalized, precisely which aspects cannot be, and which specific empirical inquiries (ecology? neuroscience? physics? psychology?) are relevant to answering those questions. Insofar as Contemporary Philosophical Naturalism follows this arduous route, it shows that there are indeed substantive grounds for, if not stereoscopic fusion, at least optimism.

[1] The current volume evolved out of papers presented at The Metaphysics of Evolutionary Naturalism, 12-14 May 2011 at the American University of Beirut.

[2] W. Sellars, “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man” in Science, Perception, and Reality (Ridgeview Press, 1963), 1-40.