Contending with Stanley Cavell

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Russell Goodman (ed.), Contending with Stanley Cavell, Oxford University Press, 2005, 216pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195175689.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Universität Erfurt / Swarthmore College


This volume is a collection of eight essays that explicate and, to a lesser extent, extend the work of Stanley Cavell. These eight essays are followed by a set of responses to them from Cavell himself, as well as a new Cavell essay on "Passionate and Performative Utterance." Two of the essays are by writers from outside philosophy: Andrew Klevan in Film Studies and Garrett Stewart in Literature. Two authors (Stephen Mulhall and Simon Critchley) are English, though Critchley now teaches in America; Sandra Laugier is a French philosopher, and the remaining contributors are all Americans. Three of the essays -- those by Rorty, Mulhall, and Critchley -- are in print elsewhere. The remaining essays are all new.

The volume is largely oriented toward the issue of Cavell's difficulty or, more exactly, of his peculiar style as a writer. Russell Goodman's first sentence in his editor's Introduction begins, "Stanley Cavell writes like no one else" (3). All the contributors dwell on this fact, attempting to describe Cavell's peculiar writerliness and to defend its significance. In this respect, the volume makes a useful companion to the recent volume Stanley Cavell in the Cambridge Contemporary Philosophy in Focus series, which rather focuses on Cavell's place in and contributions to more or less standard subfields in philosophy.[1] These two topics are naturally interdependent, and contributors in both volumes discuss both Cavell's topics and Cavell's manner. But the style, and the question of just what Cavell is doing with it, and why, are here somewhat more in the foreground.

Richard Rorty's contribution is his well-known 1981 review of Cavell's The Claim of Reason. Rorty praises Part III of that book (an account and defense of moral conversation and relationship against moral theory) and Part IV (an extended philosophical journal, drawing on Blake and Shakespeare, among others, as well as Wittgenstein), while complaining that Parts I and II (rehearsals of traditional epistemological skepticism and possible Wittgensteinian rejoinders to it) is mostly old and useless news. Cavell fails, as Rorty puts it, to show the connection between Parts I-II and Part IV, fails, that is, to take us "from epistemology to romance" (10). The timeworn and irrelevant "problems about perception" that Cavell rehearses just do not, according to Rorty, have much to do with either Kantian-Romantic worries about whether our words latch onto a world or existentialist agonies at the utter contingencies of existence. The latter are, according to Rorty, interesting and important subjects, but they are, contra Cavell's insinuations, not much illuminated by considerations drawn from traditional epistemological scepticism. This is an acute and insightful charge. But how telling it finally is depends in large measure on what one counts as an argument that would bring these topics together. As Cavell notes in his reply, The Claim of Reason concludes with an "attempt to show [skepticism's] working in Shakespearean tragedy" (159, emphases added). Rorty would no doubt reply that what we see at work in Othello is more jealousy than skepticism. But here Cavell can and does answer, with considerable plausibility, that skepticism and Othello's jealousy, in his demand for and reliance on (what he takes to be) proofs, are internally related. That Othello, or we, make such demands is what it means to say we "live our skepticism", in a formulation Cavell uses repeatedly from The Claim of Reason on.[2] (It takes Cavell's close, critical reading and writing to make this claim stand up in detail.)

Stephen Mulhall's "On Refusing to Begin" investigates and elucidates Cavell's writing in response to Anthony Kenny's complaint that The Claim of Reason "is a misshapen, undisciplined amalgam of ill-assorted parts" (cited, 22). Under Mulhall's patient attentions, however, the opening sentences of that book emerge as quite carefully written: composed in a deliberate way that is analogous to Beethoven's musical composition, where a motif must be worked through in successive sketches. As Cavell himself observes, "it is hard to imagine that one reading [The Claim of Reason's opening sentence] was unaware that its author had had some sense of its strangeness …" (163). Yet this is exactly what seems to have happened with Kenny, who must, it seems, assume that all proper philosophical writing should aspire to the transparent and neutral transmission of methodologically certified results. In contrast, as Mulhall makes clear, philosophy is, for Cavell, something composed, in a specifically modernist situation in which there is "no common fund of agreed upon conventions" (31) at hand to determine problems and solutions in a clear and stable way. Hence there is a question -- raised in the second sentence of The Claim of Reason about Philosophical Investigations but equally pertinent to the The Claim of Reason itself -- about how philosophy is, in this situation, possible at all: "How shall we let this book teach us, this or anything?" (cited, 23). As Mulhall aptly notes, this sentence is in the passive mode. It thus suggests that we need to find our way into a mode of reception instead of actively taking up an 'approach' to a problem. It is as though we must lose ourselves in order to find ourselves, as if on a quest, where what we seek can only be revealed along the way. This way of proceeding will not be to everyone's professional taste, but it may nonetheless address human possibilities and needs at a deep level that is at present hidden from us.

Simon Critchley somewhat similarly sees Cavell's conception of philosophy as "education for grownups" as an "address [to] the problems of late modernity" (38). Critchley praises Cavell's "weak messianism" and "passive practice" in response to these problems (46). He further endorses Cavell's interest in America as the "the romantic place par excellence, … the place which promises redemption" (43), but also a place in which that promise is never quite realized, as America remains "an experience of absolute disjunction" (45), "both utopia and dystopia"(46). Yet Critchley also charges that Cavell uncritically accepts an aesthetic absolutism in Emerson, when he should, more consistently, maintain his "acceptance of human finitude as that which cannot be overcome" (49). This charge, as Cavell notes, is clearly false, however, since Cavell maintains only that "Emerson's work presents itself as the realization of [a] vision" (165, emphasis added) of a union between philosophy and literature and of an achieved America. He specifically does not maintain that Emerson is successful in this presentation. (Here is where Mulhall's patience with Cavell's exact wording, however difficult, enables a more accurate response to Cavell's writing than that of Critchley, who is driving more toward maintaining his own Blanchot-derived stance regarding culture.)

Drawing on his own earlier work and that of Jonathan Lear on Kierkegaard and irony, James Conant argues that for Cavell "America", like "Christendom" for Kierkegaard, names both an observable, historical place or phenomenon and an ideal to which a people is bound but may nonetheless be failing to realize. "At one and the same time, 'America' names a certain place at a certain time and with a certain history and signifies a certain dream of what might happen in that place if certain moral and political ideals could be realized" (59). Hence it becomes possible to ask, in serious irony in a Kierkegaardian spirit, "Are there any Americans (i.e. achievers of the dream that commands and is bound to the place) in America (the geographical place itself)?" This question, as Conant sees it, is recovered by Cavell from the writing on America of Emerson and Thoreau, and it drives Cavell's own work as an American philosopher. (In an extensive note, Conant usefully compares Cavell's stance on America with Alfred Kazin's survey, in his On Native Grounds, of how major American writers have typically been torn between yearning for what is not yet achieved and estrangement from the actual, on the one hand, and love for and possession by this place, on the other). There is, Conant, finds, for Cavell "a significant internal relation between the concepts philosophy and America" (65).[3] In Cavell's perception, building on Emerson and Thoreau, certain "new possibilities [for philosophy] rested on and arose out of possibilities for cultural and intellectual newness possible only in a New World" (64). Conant's tracing of this internal relation and these possibilities makes a very effective summary of and introduction to Cavell's way of proceeding. Taken together, the essays by Conant and by Stephen Mulhall, who highlights the Wittgensteinian inheritance, offer very useful and well-considered answers to the question of why Cavell writes as he does.

Sandra Laugier, Cavell's French translator, focuses on how Cavell "shows at once the fragility and the depth of our agreements" in language (86). It is a standing task to articulate and to maintain or renovate these agreements. In taking up this task, the idea of convention is in particular no help.[4] "The idea of convention is there to at once ape and disguise [the necessity, for both sanity and community] of agreement in [not on] language" (90). That is to say, appeals to convention as something given for us and commanding over us amount to a kind of inverted Platonism that no more enables us to achieve conviction in our lives than do appeals to a Platonic heaven. "In philosophizing, I have to bring my own language and life into imagination" (91), at the risk of failing to have them and when having them is in doubt.[5] That we must and can sometimes manage this exercise of imagination, and that these facts are definitive of human personhood, amounts, Laugier usefully remarks, to a distinctively cultural and Romantic "nonpsychological treatment of the mind" (96).

Russell Goodman situates Cavell's work in the larger context of American philosophy. Against Cavell's charge that William James and John Dewey do not understand artistic modernism with its emphasis on self-transformation, Goodman argues that "doctrinally … Dewey seems close in many ways to Emerson and Cavell" (107), at least in his moments of widest concern for culture. James in particular accepted, according to Goodman, the importance in thinking of receptivity and abandonment to a movement of thought and experience that is not controlled by rule-guided intelligence (114). This is a point of contact with a strain in Wittgenstein's thinking that Cavell has particularly emphasized and developed. Yet, as Goodman also notes, concern with skepticism is pervasive in Wittgenstein's work and in Cavell's, while it is largely absent in pragmatism, at least officially (113). Behind this difference lies the further thought that doctrine and method may not be what matters most in Cavell's way of doing philosophy. Goodman alludes to this point, but does not quite develop it. His comparison between Dewey's emphasis on the importance of "the ability to learn from experience" and Emerson's use of journal materials (106) misses the big difference between them: that Emerson, like Beethoven and Wittgenstein and Cavell, uses his journal materials to sketch, revise, and combine motifs in an act of artistic composition, rather than as simpler source materials and records of progress in a Deweyan spirit.

Drawing on his own book Disclosure of the Everyday and on the work of V. F. Perkins, Andrew Klevan focuses on film's ability "to unconceal the significance which often remains buried in the habitual" (120). He understands this ability of film in terms of Cavell's work on acknowledgment and on media of art. According to Cavell, acknowledgement is the taking up, articulating, and registering of what in our experience calls for various routes of feeling and interest that we are also inclined to suppress. Among the things in our experience that may demand acknowledgment are, centrally, the pain of another, the independent personhood of another, our own finitude, and our possibilities for meaningful expression beyond the reach of conventions alone. A medium of art, according to Cavell, functions to carry out the work of acknowledgment, at least when its distinctive possibilities of notice and expression are masterfully developed. In a wonderful close reading of certain moments and motifs in Frank Capra's It's A Wonderful Life, Klevan shows in detail how Capra does this work. Under the influence of Cavell's thought, he achieves a depth of attention all at once to plot, camera movement, and filmed subjects and objects (in particular the banister knob that is always coming off in Jimmy Stewart's hand) that deserves to be a model for the study of film as an art. Here is a region in which we can see an influence of Cavell's style of attention at work, in a way that goes well beyond simply applying philosophical theses. With luck, this style of attention will be taken up in film study and the study of art in culture more generally. It should be.

Garrett Stewart's somewhat cranky but deeply felt report on Cavell and literary scholarship argues that, alas, for the most part, Cavell's work on Shakespeare, Thoreau and film, despite its (halfheartedly?) acknowledged importance, is not being understood or appreciated within currently dominant strains of literary scholarship. The reason for this, Stewart argues, is that Cavell's "liberal humanism" and "heroic individualism" (141) -- or his continuing modernist stance and sensibility -- cut radically against "the dissolution of authorial into social energy" (143) that is typically taken for granted in New Historicism and other forms of politicized post-structuralism. As Stewart puts it, it is taken for granted in contemporary literary studies, in the wakes of Derrida, Foucault, Lacan, and Butler, that "the subject is theatricalized from within, a construct and an enactment" (147), without any possibilities of integrity or coherent expressiveness. From within this stance, Stewart reports, "the skills and the taste and the very aspiration [for full critical attention to the literary] have atrophied" (153). Almost nobody, that is to say, really reads anymore in advanced literary studies classrooms. My own sense is that this report is somewhat exaggerated. What goes on in the literary classrooms I know is an ill-sorted mixture in which, nonetheless, close reading in appreciation of figuration, emotion, and emplotment still sometimes magically takes place. But Stewart is right that it does not take place as often as it used to, and that this form of attention is discredited in many advanced journals and books not only as a private enthusiasm but also as a supposedly na•ve form of regression. Stewart concludes more hopefully, however, with a reading of one four-word sentence from Cavell's 1971 The World Viewed: "They, there, are free." "What is this [sentence]," he asks, "but philosophy as criticism as poetry?" (153). If this kind of writing is still possible, and if it continues to demand and to win the style of critical attention that Cavell himself has developed, perhaps there is some hope for maintaining a sense of human life in which adventures of meaningfulness are still possible, no matter how sophisticated we have become about the forces of contexts.

Cavell's responses to the essays are typically appreciative and reflective, while sometimes offering useful counters, for example to Rorty and to Critchley. In a particularly naked and therefore useful sentence, Cavell writes that, in contrast with the pragmatist sense of human life, "the human existence that is portrayed in Philosophical Investigations, as I see it, is one of continuous compromise with restlessness, disorientation, phantasms of loneliness and devastation, dotted with assertions of emptiness that defeat sociability as they seek it" (161). This sentence alone, I think, affords a sharp sense of what is most interesting and important, and also most foreign to most of professional philosophy, in Cavell's way of thinking about human life. If this is what human life is like, and if philosophizing in this condition requires registering such compromises and self-defeats, while trying exploratively to do better, then there can be, Cavell argues, "no formal criterion of philosophy" (168), which must rather be understood as a work of writing and thinking that finds its value in the readings and responses that it calls forth. "One's quest for reason and for freedom requires a perpetual overcoming of guises in oneself in which reason and freedom are beguiled, fixated, stranded" (168).

The essay of Cavell's that concludes the collection is entitled "Passionate and Performative Utterances." In it, Cavell undertakes to characterize the logic, as it were, of passionate utterances by drawing on Austin's mostly undeveloped account of perlocutions. There are, Cavell argues, conditions for the happy achievement of perlocutionary effects, that is, of the appropriate "uptake" in an audience. When passion is expressed in speech or song, there are, however, in particular no accepted conventional procedures for expression and the achievement of effect. Instead we find a declaration, grounded in feeling, that singles out someone (you) and demands a response in kind. A passionate utterance, as Cavell puts it, "characteristically puts the future of our relationship, as part of my sense of my identity, or of my existence, more radically at stake" (194). It is not, I think, much of a leap to take this remark as characterizing also Cavell's own passionate writing that is directed to us, as he puts his own sense of identity and existence at stake. Hence I take Cavell's staking of himself as a declaration of love and an expression of hope for a future -- for himself, for us (his readers), for philosophy, and for America.

[1] Richard Eldridge (ed.), Stanley Cavell (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).

[2] For a further explication and defense of how Cavell's appeal to lived skepticism works as a reply to Rorty, see Richard Eldridge, "A Continuing Task': Cavell and the Truth of Skepticism," in Richard Fleming and Michael Payne (eds.), The Senses of Stanley Cavell (Fairfield, NJ: Associated University Presses, 1989), pp. 78-89; reprinted in Eldridge, The Persistence of Romanticism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001), pp.189-204.

[3] On this point, compare Eldridge, "Cavell on American Philosophy and the Idea of America," in Stanley

Cavell, pp. 172-189.

[4] On this point, compare Steven G. Affeldt, "The Ground of Mutuality: Criteria, Judgment and Intelligibility in Stephen Mulhall and Stanley Cavell," European Journal of Philosophy 6, 1 (Apr 1998), pp. 1-31.

[5] On this point, compare Eldridge, "Romantic Rebirth in a Secular Age: Cavell's Aversive Exertions," The Journal of Religion 71, 3 (July 1991), pp. 410-18 and "Cavell and Hšlderlin on Human Immigrancy," in The Persistence of Romanticism, pp. 229-45.