Content and Consciousness Revisited, with Replies by Daniel Dennett

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Carlos Muñoz-Suárez and Felipe De Brigard (eds.), Content and Consciousness Revisited, with Replies by Daniel Dennett, Springer, 2015, 219pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319173733.

Reviewed by Richard Brown, LaGuardia Community College, CUNY


Originally published in 1969, Content and Consciousness is the product of Daniel Dennett's DPhil at Oxford with Gilbert Ryle. In it, Dennett attempts to defuse the mind-body problem. This problem, going back at least to Descartes, was that of explaning how the mind and the physical body interact with each other. In Content and Consciousness Dennett sets out a framework for thinking about the relation of the mind to the brain that he is continuing to develop to this day. His solution is ingenious but very controversial. It begins by dividing the problem into giving a theory of mental content and a theory of consciousness. On the one hand he wants to avoid positing that mental items are brain events, as the identity theory or functionalism does. On the other hand he wants to acknowledge that folk psychology, our pre-theoretic account of how the mind works, is incredibly useful and allows us to often say things that are true about minds. So, though there is nothing in the brain which would count as a belief or a desire, it is nonetheless true that I believe and desire various things.

Dennett's theory of mental content blossomed into his account of the intentional stance and perhaps culminates in his paper "Real Patterns" while his theory of consciousness blooms into his Multiple Drafts, or fame in the brain, theory and is forcefully argued for in Consciousness Explained. These later works all develop, elaborate, and clarify the ideas and arguments first laid out in Content and Consciousness. As Dennett himself puts it, he sees that early work as a "philosophical kitchen, stocked with almost all the utensils and containers, all the ingredients and methods, from which I have concocted the rest of my work," (x).

Content and Consciousness Revisited is the seventh in Springer's Studies in Brain and Mind series and has 10 chapters plus a foreword and a response to each chapter by Dennett. The volume's aim is to revisit "hypotheses, concepts and distinctions introduced in Consciousness and Content from an updated interdisciplinary standpoint," (1). Dennett's foreword offers a nice look into the writing and early reception of his book. He recounts his time as a graduate student and young faculty member and how close he came to giving up on the project in response to the difficulty he had in trying to get the first chapter published as a journal article. He goes on to discuss the book's reception, its negative and positive reviews. The rest is history. In the almost 50 years since it's publication the book, and the ideas it has inspired, has made a tremendous impact on the philosophy of mind. This is because, agree with him or not, in fact understand him or not, Dennett's ideas are, as J. J. C. Smart says in his review in Mind (1970), interesting, original, and highly stimulating.

The essays in the volume are clearly written and largely offer constructive criticism and friendly amendments. Dennett's replies are personable and supportive and for the most part informative. Overall I enjoyed reading the book (and re-reading Consciousness and Content while I awaited the book) and I learned a lot from the various exchanges. Much has changed in the philosophy of mind since the mid-sixties, in particular the empirically-informed philosophy of mind that Dennett was an early advocate of is now firmly a part of the Anglophone tradition, but his steadfast commitment to finding an anti-Cartesian theory of mind has remained the same.

Chapter one, the introduction by Carlos Muñoz-Suárez, explores themes in Content and Consciousness. He sets out '7 seeds' which Dennett developed in his later work. These are 1. (A forerunner to) the intentional stance, 2. Motivation for evolutionary naturalism, 3. An account of learning in terms of 'intra-cerebral evolution', 4. The first teleofunctional theory of content, 5. The personal/sub-personal distinction, 6. An explanation of introspection in terms of logical states of a cerebral computer, and 7. An early critique of pictorial models of imagination. Most of the attention in the volume is on the intentional stance and the personal/sub-personal distinction. Content and Consciousness often serves as more of a springboard and most authors take into account much of Dennett's later work.

In chapter two, Don Ross argues that Dennett makes a contribution to scientific understanding on the basis of philosophical investigation. Ross contends that Dennett's theory of the mind as a 'Joycean' virtual machine installed in the brain counts as making a genuine contribution to certain sciences (in particular cognitive ethology and cognitive developmental psychology (35)). Underlying this argument is the one presented in James Ladyman and Ross (2007) to the effect that the role of philosophy consists in unifying different sciences rather than navigating between the manifest and scientific images. This is an interesting debate over the role of philosophy with regard to science and I found myself wishing that Dennett had engaged more with the point being made.

Next, Felipe De Brigard argues against intentional realism and eliminative materialism. In particular he argues against the claim that since folk psychology is a successful theory it must be describing something real inside of our heads. Dennett responds by emphasizing his denial of the claim that folk psychology is a theory. He says he thinks of it as a strategy, a way of imposing order on something that is complex and chaotic.

Keith Frankish's is the first of three chapters on the personal/sub-personal distinction. Frankish approaches it from the standpoint of dual process theories of thinking and argues that we can see a way of thinking about Dennett's view that lets us construct a dual process account. Dual process accounts distinguish between Type 1 thinking, which is unconscious, quick and effortless and Type 2, thinking which is slow, conscious and deliberate. To remind oneself of this distinction one can think about the classic puzzle from Daniel Kahneman's (2011) Thinking, Fast and Slow: If a bat and a ball together cost $1.10 and the bat's cost is exactly $1.00 more than the ball, then how much does the ball cost? Most people immediately think "ten cents" but this is incorrect. To arrive at the correct conclusion one must engage in the personal level activity of reasoning. Frankish argues that we can see the beginnings of a dual process model here where Type 1 processes are all sub-personal and Type 2 processes are personal level activities. He concludes by sketching a dual attitude account of belief. In Dennett's response he endorses Frankish's account and suggests that an important part of the story is his account of the way in which Type 2 thinking gets installed in human brains, which amounts to its being a "learned, culturally borne, personal-level activity," (203).

Richard Dub looks at the rationality constraint inherent in the intentional stance and argues that it should not be an assumption but rather an empirical discovery. His focus is on the intentional stance as applied to human psychology and he distinguishes between its use by the individual in their day-to-day lives and its use by the scientist in a theory of the mind. Dub suggests that we can safely assume individuals are rational without positing a rationality constraint on our psychological theorizing. Dennett responds by emphasizing that the rationality constraint is a 'bold idealization' and this is the very reason we can apply the intentional stance to such a wide variety of things (Dennett's examples include "computer chess programs, Martians, [and] the R&D of natural selection" (206)). The rationality constraint for Dennett is a simplifying assumption on par with assuming that all the parts of a machine are working properly as you begin to try to figure out how it works from the design stance.

Sam Wilkinson's is the second chapter on the personal/sub-personal distinction; he looks at it from the perspective of neuropsychiatry. Wilkinson finds two versions of the distinction. One is an early one on which personal level explanations are non-mechanistic and aim at rendering the subject intelligible (116). The other is a later distinction which invokes not explanation but prediction. Wilkinson provides a very interesting discussion of some of the symptoms of schizophrenia and Capgras delusion, and argues that the earlier distinction does a better job at capturing what is used by neuropsychiatrists. Dennett responds by clarifying his thoughts on the relationship between intelligibility and predictability. He reaffirms that the personal level is non-mechanistic and stresses the link between intelligibility and predictability. The intelligibility of some behavior is closely associated with our ability to make predictions from the intentional stance (211).

Martin Roth looks at the personal/sub-personal distinction from the point of view of the extended mind debate. He argues that the sub-personal states do not extend beyond the brain but it is plausible to think of personal level states as being extended. Ellen Fridland offers an account of intelligence as intimately related to learning inspired by Dennett's connection of learning to intelligent storage of information. John Michael suggests a way to understand the relationship between the mind and society as consisting in a developmental feedback loop. Dennett largely agrees with all three authors and uses his response to clarify and emphasize the main points.

Pete Mandik examines David Rosenthal's attempt to respond to Dennett's Orwellian/Stalinesque argument using the higher-order thought theory of consciousness. Mandik argues that the issues having to do with higher-order misrepresentation, as in the case where one has a higher-order state representing that one is seeing blue but no actual state that would count as a first-order seeing of blue, ultimately collapse the higher-order thought theory into a version of Dennett's First-Person Operationalism, or Multiple Drafts, theory of consciousness. This was the only chapter that I had a substantive philosophical disagreement with and will spend the rest of the review examining Mandik's argument in detail.

It is helpful to recall the color phi phenomenon in which a person is presented two differently colored lights that are blinking on and off but has the conscious experience of a single light moving across the screen and changing color. Dennett argues that there are two competing interpretations of what is happening here and no way to distinguish them. The Stalinesque way of doing things posits that one has an actual conscious experience of a single light moving and changing color that is wrong while the Orwellian posits accurate conscious experience of the two lights flashing which are remembered incorrectly as a single light moving and changing color.

On Mandik's Orwellian construal we have first-order sensory states that count as sensations of blinking red and green lights and these two states are conscious in virtue of their relation to a higher-order thought targeting them. The content of the higher-order state represents these first-order states as being a single circle moving and changing color. The higher-order state, for Mandik, counts as the false memory and the first-order states count as conscious experiences (since they are targeted by the higher-order state) but since they are accurate first-order representations he counts that as completing the Orwellian interpretation. We have a conscious accurate first-order state and a false higher-order state making it conscious.

For the Stalinesque interpretation we have the same higher-order state on Mandik's reading but it is now targeting a different first-order state. The first-order state in this case would be a new first-order state that represents a circle moving and changing color. This state could have been caused by the (unconscious) accurate first-order representations of the blinking lights. This is now the target of the higher-order state. The first-order state which falsely represents a single circle moving and changing color is now conscious in virtue of an accurate higher-order state (that is, accurate about the first-order state it targets). In both cases we have the very same kind of higher-order state which represents that I am seeing a single circle moving and changing color but in the Stallinesque version it is accurate and in the Orwellian it is inaccurate.

So if we have a relational version of the higher-order theory we can distinguish the two cases. But what happens when we switch to the non-relational version? The main claim of the non-relational version of the higher-order theory is that consciousness simply consists in having the appropriate kind of higher-order representation and that this kind of representation is of roughly the sort posited by the higher-order thought theory. This account is not put in terms of a relation that this higher-order state has to a first-order state. Mandik argues that if we consider the case where we are missing the first-order state altogether then we in effect have reduced the higher-order thought theory to a version of Dennett's first-person operationalism.

However, when we look at Mandik's interpretation we see that he takes the first-order state's being accurate as enough to secure the Orwellian interpretation, but this does not seem right to me. When we say that in the Orwellian interpretation you have an accurate conscious experience we mean that what it is like for you is like consciously experiencing stationary circles and that after this has happened you have a false memory of a single moving circle changing color. If we are thinking in terms of the non-relational version of the higher-order thought theory then in the Orwellian case we would have the accurate first-order states as Mandik posits but not, or at least not initially, any higher-order states about a single moving circle. What you would have is a higher-order state to the effect that you were seeing two differently colored blinking lights, and so you would consciously experience that, even if only briefly. After this you would have the false memory which we could interpret as a further (suitable) higher-order state showing up and describing things in terms of a single circle moving and changing color. All of these higher-order states could be targeting the very same (accurate) first-order states (at different times).

In the Stalinesque case what we want is a conscious experience that gets things wrong as they are happening rather than after the fact. In this case we posit that there are the two first-order states, in the previous case but they now are targeted by a higher-order state representing them as being one circle that is moving and changing color. We then have an accurate memory of having consciously experienced the moving circle. We never get the accurate conscious experience (that is, what it is like for the subject is never accurate in this case). Now we can see that there is indeed a difference between the two cases that has to do with certain higher-order states showing up and having their effects and with whether the conscious experience of the subject, in terms of what it is like for them, is ever accurately capturing the first-order activity. This is all quite independent of what, if any, relations these higher-order states have to the first-order states. If we think of the same kind of case as described minus the first-order states then the conscious experience of the subject, ex hypothesi, will be the same but their non-verbal behavior will be different without the first-order states.

Dennett does not engage with the details of Mandik's argument but instead responds by reiterating his view of consciousness as 'fame in the brain' and contrasting it with his 'known by the King' caricature of the higher-order theory. As Dennett construes higher-order theories, they rely on a Cartesian model of the mind and "an unanalyzed res cogitans, [as] the thinker of those thoughts" (p 218). He is right that the 'I' in the higher-order thought needs to be accounted for but wrong if he thinks that must be done in Cartesian terms (see, for example, Hakwan Lau and Richard Brown's forthcoming "Empirical Case for Consciousness without First-Order Representations"). Higher-order theories in general build on the idea that consciousness crucially depends on a kind of inner awareness of my own mental life. Dennett, on the other hand, clearly intends his talk of 'fame in the brain' to align his view with the Global Workspace Theory of consciousness (he cites Stanislas Dehaene's 2014 Consciousness and the Brain as giving the most current empirical evidence for his views (218)). He clearly also has a particular interpretation of that theory involving the intentional stance and the personal/sub-personal distinction, both of which seem to be optional add-ons to the Global Workspace account. Here was another place I found myself wishing that Dennett had engaged with the issues in more depth (see Susan Schneider's 2007 "Daniel Dennett on the Nature of Consciousness" for some interesting discussion of overall similarities and differences between Dennett and Global Workspace Theory).

Dennett's challenging and influential attempts to solve the mind-body problem have rightly earned him notoriety. Though I can highly recommend the book I do wish there had been more interaction between Dennett and the authors, perhaps even the inclusion of some philosophers more critical or skeptical of the feasibility of Dennett's project (as I would be). But then again, critics abound and it is nice to see Dennett's ideas being explored, refined, and connected to contemporary interdisciplinary endeavors in the cognitive sciences, including by Dennett himself!