Content and Justification: Philosophical Papers

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Paul Boghossian, Content and Justification: Philosophical Papers, Oxford University Press, 2008, 358pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199292165.

Reviewed by Clayton Littlejohn, University of Texas at San Antonio


Content and Justification is a wonderful collection that brings together fourteen of the more important essays Paul Boghossian has written over the past twenty years. Each essay has been published previously. Two were co-authored with David Velleman. Besides a very brief introduction and some lists of suggested reading, there is nothing new here. Still, many of the essays contained in this volume have been incredibly influential and as each one of them repays careful study it is not hard to recommend this volume to philosophers interested in epistemology and the philosophy of mind or language. I have to admit that I am a fan of Boghossian's work, but often it seemed that important details were missing or Boghossian could have been a bit more careful in presenting the issues. I also wish he had said more about his current views concerning those topics he has not written on recently. For example, in the introduction he says that he still thinks we do not have a satisfactory understanding of how it could be that we know our own minds if externalism about thought content is true. When he wrote his essays on self-knowledge, he said that the arguments that led to the skeptical conclusion that we do not know our own minds are not ones he thought we could accept. He says little about why he is attracted to the views that seem to give rise to these (allegedly) intolerable epistemological problems and nothing about why he thinks that nothing that has been written in the past decade adequately addresses his persisting doubts.

Let me begin by giving a very general overview. In Part I, 'The Nature of Content', Boghossian covers a great deal of territory. He surveys the 1980s literature on Kripke's arguments for meaning-skepticism, advances an argument for the incoherence of irrealism about content, argues that the prospects for the project of naturalizing content are dim, outlines a strategy for defending a version of the thesis that content is normative, and tries to show that Kripke's arguments for meaning-skepticism cause significant trouble for a natural picture of rational belief.

In Part II, 'Content and Self-Knowledge', Boghossian argues that externalism about thought content generates a host of epistemological problems. If the arguments in this section are sound, content externalism challenges the idea that we enjoy a kind of privileged access to our own minds. Moreover, if the contents of our thoughts depend (in part) upon matters external to us, we might not be able to know our minds at all. Additionally, the content externalist has to deny that we can know apriori what the logical properties of our thoughts are as the externalist has to concede that we cannot determine apriori whether two token thoughts have the same content. Finally, Boghossian argues that the compatibilists (i.e., those who combine the doctrine of privileged access with content externalism) are committed to the possibility of knowing apriori that certain contingent propositions about the external world are true.

In Part III, 'Content and the Apriori', Boghossian argues that Quine's arguments against the apriori and analyticity are toothless unless these arguments are advanced alongside Quine's arguments for the indeterminacy of meaning. He agrees that the metaphysical notion of analyticity is hopeless, but insists that there is no good reason to think there is anything wrong with the epistemic notion of analyticity. (A sentence is metaphysically analytic if it owes its truth entirely to its meaning without any contribution from the facts whereas a sentence is epistemically analytic if grasp of the sentence's meaning can suffice for justified belief in the truth of the proposition that sentence expresses (p. 225).) If he's right in saying that meaning realists should have no problem with the notion of epistemic analyticity (and I'm inclined to think he is), he has shown that those who reject Quine's meaning-skepticism can say that it is possible to be justified in believing some sentence to be true simply in virtue of a grasp of its meaning. If we assume that the meaning realist's view withstands Quine's attacks, we have to assume that there are facts about what meanings various expressions have. We cannot dismiss the possibility that multiple expressions might come to the same meanings, so it should come as no surprise to discover that there will be pairs of sentences that share meaning, differing only in that the first sentence contains expressions synonymous with expressions contained in the second sentence. By substituting synonyms for synonyms, we could know that these sentences are true on the basis of knowledge of meaning and logic. Later in Part III, Boghossian defends the view that we have an apriori justification for certain epistemic beliefs (i.e., beliefs that by complying to certain rules of inference we can form justified beliefs) in virtue of our grasp of certain concepts. It is by grasping certain logical concepts that we can have a rule-circular justification for believing that some epistemic principles are objectively valid. It is a separate issue to state what role these principles play in the justification of non-epistemic beliefs. Boghossian argues that when we make inferential transitions in accordance with an epistemic rule where the transition is built into the possession conditions of some (non-defective) concept that we grasp, the beliefs arrived at by means of these transitions can be justified when our grasp of that concept is part of what explains the transition.

In Part IV, 'Color: Concepts and Properties', Boghossian and Velleman argue that given what we know about our experience of color and color concepts we can say that color properties are not properties of external objects. They argue that color cannot be understood as either a dispositional property of an external object or identified with some other (non-dispositional) physical property. The positive proposal they defend is a kind of projectivist view on which external objects have intrinsic color properties of the visual field, properties that external objects cannot have for the obvious reason that they are not part of the visual field.

In what follows, I shall discuss some of the material from Parts I and II, material that I wish Boghossian had revisited to clarify his current views in light of the literature that address his work.

In Chapter 2, 'The Status of Content', Boghossian argues that irrealism about content is incoherent. His argument is complicated, but a crude version can be stated as follows. The irrealist about content thinks that the central predicates in our content discourse do not pick out properties, either because the properties are not there to be picked out or because the function of these predicates is not to pick out any property at all. If the irrealist opts for a kind of error-theory, it seems the error-theorist is committed to the following claim:

(1) All sentences of the form 'S has truth-condition p' are false.

The sentences that (1) says are false (i.e., sentences that attribute truth-conditions) must have truth-conditions if (1) is true. Thus, (1) implies that sentences that attribute truth-conditions have truth-conditions and lack them (p. 63). If the irrealist opts instead for a kind of non-factualist treatment of sentences containing content predicates, the irrealist cannot adopt a deflationary conception of truth because the deflationist would want to say that any meaningful declarative sentence would be truth-conditional (p. 57). Combining non-factualism about content discourse with some robust conception of truth, however, leads to contradiction. If truth is robust, judgments about whether sentences possess the property picked out by the truth predicate must be factual. Thus, judgments about whether content-attributing sentences are truth-conditional must be factual. But, non-factualism about the content-attributing sentences implies that judgments about a sentence's truth cannot be factual since such judgments could only concern factual matters if it was a factual matter whether these content-attributing sentences had meaning. Boghossian concludes that the non-factualist treats truth as if it is robust while denying that truth is a robust property.

If Boghossian's argument for the incoherence of content irrealism succeeds, he has shown that Kripke's argument for meaning-skepticism cannot establish what it was intended to. In Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language, Kripke argued for the startling conclusion that there are no facts that determine whether any individual ever attaches a particular meaning to any symbol they use. To use Kripke's example, consider two binary functions, addition and quaddition, that agree for all arguments we have considered thus far but yield different values when they take arguments we have not considered previously. It might seem, for example, that you have been using '+' to mean addition all these years, but it seems that none of the facts about you that might possibly explain how you managed to latch onto addition rather than quaddition could in fact explain how you managed to do this. Boghossian agrees with Kripke that facts about your past use of an expression or your disposition to use it in a certain way could not determine what you mean by this expression because there is an infinite number of truths about how the expression is correctly applied but only a finite number of dispositions to use it in certain ways (p. 11). Bracketing this worry, it seemed to Boghossian and to Kripke that such facts about you can only explain how you will use the expression, but they cannot possibly explain how the expression should be used (p. 34). Against Wright's suggestion that Kripke's argument is powerless against a judgment-dependent conception of meaning, Boghossian argues that some judgment-independent notion of content is needed if there are to be content-determining judgments at all (p. 47).

Boghossian thinks that a kind of 'robust realism' about mental content survives Kripke's skeptical attack. (The robust realist is someone who thinks that judgments about meaning are factual, denies that the facts about meaning are judgment dependent, and denies that these facts can be reduced to any further facts.) While he says little about how the robust realist manages to avoid the difficulties that beset naturalism, that is perhaps because his efforts have been dedicated to showing that some view must overcome these difficulties and arguing that robust realism is the only view left standing that might manage to do this.

Boghossian's main complaint about naturalism appears to be that the naturalists who try to give a theory of content by specifying the natural properties that suffice for the instantiation of an intentional property cannot assign the right contents to our thoughts. Such theories need what they cannot have: a naturalistically respectable account of optimality conditions (i.e., conditions under which a subject cannot make mistaken judgments about whether something falls within the extension of some expression). Boghossian offers the following explanation for why these theories need optimality conditions. The content of my concept of horse, for example, cannot be determined by whatever it is that determines my disposition to judge that something falls under that concept. For if the content were so determined, then my concept of horse would properly apply to some horses along with misshapen cows, mules, cleverly disguised zebras, etc. It seems that the naturalist has to say that the content of my concept of horse is determined by whatever it is that determines my disposition to judge that something falls under the concept when that concept is deployed under optimal conditions. The problem, Boghossian says, is that we cannot possibly specify the optimality conditions in such a way that I specify conditions under which the concept is never misapplied in purely naturalistic terms (p. 39).

Perhaps the thing for the naturalist to say is that, even if we cannot characterize the optimality conditions in naturalist terms, it does not follow that optimality conditions do not exist. In Chapter 3, 'Naturalizing Content', Boghossian suggests that naturalists need to be more ambitious than this. The naturalist is committed to (at least) the weak supervenience thesis that states that there are no two objects in any given world that are alike in terms of their physical properties but differ with respect to their intentional properties. The problem with naturalism about intentional properties is this: unlike the case of evaluative properties, where anyone who has a grasp of the relevant evaluative concepts is in a position to appreciate that any two things alike in terms of their non-evaluative properties must be alike in terms of their evaluative properties, it seems perfectly intelligible to deny that intentional properties weakly supervene upon the natural properties. Thus, Boghossian suggests, the naturalist has to justify her commitment to the supervenience thesis by specifying a set of physical conditions sufficient to make it the case that some intentional property is instantiated (p. 72). One thing that strikes me as odd about this view is that Boghossian recognizes that the naturalist can defend the weak supervenience thesis by giving some independent argument for thinking that the intentional properties supervene upon the natural properties (e.g., by pointing to considerations having to do with mental causation) instead of carrying out the ambitious project of showing that some specific natural properties are sufficient for the instantiation of some intentional properties. This suggests that Boghossian's case against naturalism depends upon his establishing that the optimality conditions do not exist rather than establishing just that they cannot be characterized in naturalistically respectable terms. Given the possibility of giving independent arguments for naturalism, it seems that Boghossian's arguments might show that the naturalist view is unsatisfying without showing that it is unsound.

In his earlier discussion of naturalism, it seemed that Boghossian was willing to follow Kripke's lead in saying that the normativity of meaning and/or content presented a serious challenge for the naturalist. I think it is worth noting that Boghossian's views concerning normativity evolve in the papers in this collection. In Chapter 1, 'The Rule-Following Considerations', he writes:

Suppose the expression 'green' means green. It follows immediately that the expression 'green' applies correctly only to these things (the green ones) and not to those (the non-greens). The fact that the expression means something implies … a whole set of normative truths about my behaviour with that expression: namely, that my use of it is correct in application to certain objects and not in application to others. (p. 15)

Here, he seems to endorse the idea that meaning is normative in this attenuated sense: meaningful expressions have correctness conditions or truth-conditions. If we were to say that the naturalist cannot account for the idea that meaning is normative in this sense, we would have to show that if naturalism were true, nothing could have any sort of correctness conditions at all. It seems we should distinguish two (potential) criticisms of naturalism. The first is that the naturalist cannot show how, if naturalism is true, something could possess correctness conditions. The second is that the naturalist cannot show how things could have the correctness conditions we know them to have. Boghossian's arguments seem to be primarily concerned with the second criticism, not the first. So, it seems that Boghossian's arguments do not really show that the normativity thesis as he initially understood it causes trouble for naturalism. Moreover, he comes to recognize that there must be more to the normativity of meaning or content than just the idea that there are things that have correctness conditions. Assertions can be correct or incorrect, but he thinks there is no straightforward way in which something counts as a normative notion just because it has a correctness condition or truth-condition (p. 98). It would seem, then, that Boghossian not only does not provide much by way of argument for the claim that the normativity of meaning (in the attenuated sense) causes trouble for naturalism, he comes to think that it is a mistake to think that meaning is normative in any interesting sense.

It might seem that if Boghossian would just deny that meaning is normative, he would be in a position to reject a crucial assumption in Kripke's arguments for meaning-skepticism. I think I know why Boghossian does not go this route. He notes that Kripke's argument for meaning-skepticism is no threat to the meaning realist unless it is directed at realism about both linguistic meaning and mental content. If Kripke's argument addresses only the realist about linguistic meaning, the realist can dispense with Kripke's argument by opting for the Gricean view that grounds facts about linguistic meaning in facts about mental content. So, while he gives up the idea that linguistic meaning is normative he does not think that 'going non-normative' is the way to deal with Kripke's skeptical argument because he holds onto the idea that mental content is normative in something more than just the attenuated sense considered above.

In Chapter 4, 'Is Meaning Normative?', Boghossian considers whether mental content or linguistic meaning could be said to be normative in some more interesting sense than just that linguistic expressions and thoughts have truth-conditions. The normativity thesis he considers in Chapter 4 can be stated as follows:

(NT) An expression E expresses a normative notion only if it is constitutive of our understanding of E that its application implies an ought or a may. (p. 98)

He advances the following strategy for defending the thesis that content is normative. First, he argues that beliefs are normative in the sense that it is constitutive of our understanding of belief that its application implies an ought:

no desire or decision is needed for it to be true that I ought to believe that 68 + 57 = 125. Indeed, the very fact that the imperative here is not hypothetical is, as I've just been arguing, a defining feature of belief. It is what makes it the state that it is. (p. 102)

Second, he argues for the primacy of belief thesis, the thesis that our grasp of the notion of content depends upon our grasping the concept of belief. The justification he offers for the primacy of belief thesis is a bit sketchy, but he suggests that our grasp of concepts for mental states other than belief asymmetrically depends upon our grasp of a concept for belief and that we cannot make sense of the idea of creatures that have contentful mental states without belief (p. 104). If this is right, then the notion of content is a normative notion because the notion of belief is.

I don't think this line of argument for the normativity of content is all that promising. Given the significance of the normativity thesis in the debates surrounding Kripke's skeptical arguments, I wish Boghossian had worked out his argument for the normativity thesis in greater detail and explained at greater length why a notion counts as a normative notion if it meets the conditions specified in (NT). It seems that someone could have an adequate grasp of the concept of belief and deploy that concept in explaining the behavior of some non-human animals while plausibly denying that there are any facts about what such creatures ought to believe or oughtn't believe. This suggests that belief might not be a normative notion in Boghossian's sense since this speaker would assert that some creature believes p, would seem to know full well how things would have to be for her assertion to be true, but she might see no connection between her belief ascriptions and any further claims about how things ought to be. If someone insisted that such creatures did not have beliefs on the grounds that such creatures are under no sort of epistemic obligation, that would suggest that insofar as we can explain the behavior of such creatures by ascribing them propositional attitudes we should deny the primacy-of-belief thesis. I don't see that Boghossian provides us with any particularly compelling rationale for holding onto the idea that beliefs are normative in some more interesting sense than just that they have truth-conditions.

Let’s turn now to some of the material from Part II. Boghossian argues in Chapter 6, 'Content and Self-Knowledge', that we could not know our own minds if the contents of our thoughts were determined (in part) by conditions external to us. His thesis is more radical than the typical incompatibilist thesis that externalism is incompatible with immediate or direct knowledge of our own minds. Boghossian thinks that we cannot have this or any other kind of knowledge of our own minds if externalism is true. Part of the problem, he says, is that the externalist cannot say that we have privileged self-knowledge. In brief, his argument is this. If externalism is true, then the contents of our thoughts are extrinsic or relational properties of those thoughts (p. 146) and it seems we cannot know by inspection or observation what something's relational or extrinsic properties are (p. 150). Thus, we have no non-inferential knowledge of the contents of our thoughts if externalism is true. Moreover, if we cannot have non-inferential knowledge of our own minds, we cannot have inferential knowledge of our own minds because such inferential knowledge depends, in part, upon non-inferential knowledge of the contents of those mental states that serve as the basis for our inferential knowledge (p. 144).

It might seem that the problem arises only against the background assumption that self-knowledge is akin to inner observation, but Boghossian thinks that slow switching cases cause trouble even for those accounts that think of judgments about our own minds as being cognitively insubstantial. Some say that some judgments about our own minds can constitute knowledge when such judgments are self-verifying. If I judge that I am thinking about p, the second-order judgment cannot be mistaken because it is self-verifying. Here is why he thinks even self-verifying judgments are problematic. Right now you will judge that you are thinking about water. (Just try to resist.) Suppose that after thinking this thought you are surreptitiously switched to Twin Earth. Having spent considerable time away from home, you are now disposed to express the belief that twater is wet when you say 'Water is wet'. If it is then revealed that a switch had occurred and you try to determine whether your self-verifying judgment concerned water or twater, it seems that there is no way you could know which substance you were thinking about then. Boghossian thinks that this gives us reason to question whether your self-verifying judgment constituted knowledge in the first place because it seems that if you knew p in the first place and did not forget anything between then and now, you should know p now (p. 158).

It seems that content externalists will take issue with a host of Boghossian's assumptions. First, it is not obvious that the content externalist is committed to the view that the contents of all of our thoughts have wide-content. If only some of our thoughts have wide-content, it seems that the content externalist could say that we have privileged access to those thoughts with narrow-content and then say that our knowledge of such thoughts could serve as part of the basis for inferential judgments about those thoughts that have wide-content. Second, it is not obvious that the content externalist is committed to the view that the content properties of thoughts with wide-content are relational or extrinsic properties of those thoughts or why it would be damaging for the externalist to adopt this view. Let's consider these points in turn. The thought experiments that motivate content externalism do nothing to motivate the idea that whatever it is that we identify with (say) our token mental states are items that strongly supervene upon our internal properties, which perhaps only have their contents contingently. They only motivate the view that it is possible for two individuals with the same internal properties to have different thoughts. Thus, the externalist could accept the principle that we can never tell by inspection what something's extrinsic or relational properties are without conceding that we cannot tell by inspecting our thoughts what the contents of those thoughts are. We need to distinguish an individual having a thought that p, in part, because of that individual's relational or extrinsic properties from a thought's being about p being a relational or extrinsic property of that thought. Bracket this point because there is a more important point here. Boghossian's argument proceeds from the assumption that we cannot know non-inferentially what something's extrinsic or relational properties are. Surely there are cases where we cannot know non-inferentially what something's non-intrinsic properties are (e.g., we cannot know non-inferentially whether this hunk of metal is a real dime rather than a counterfeit), but it seems that I can know non-inferentially that this hunk is in my left hand, that it has been placed to the left of me, or that it is near to me. If the young Kant was right, the difference between right and left hands is not a difference in their intrinsic properties. It seems that if you cannot know non-inferentially whether a left hand is a left hand or whether something is to the left of you, you will never learn right from left.

Boghossian's attack on cognitively insubstantial accounts of self-knowledge invokes an epistemic principle that content externalists and internalists ought to reject. In arguing against Burge's account of basic self-knowledge, he tries to show that self-verifying judgments do not constitute self-knowledge if the contents of some of the concepts that figure in those judgments are individuated externally. To show that self-verifying judgments involving wide-contents do not constitute knowledge, he helps himself to the following epistemic principle about memory and knowledge:

(MK) If initially S knows p and if at some later time S remembers everything S knew initially, then S knows p at this later time.

He says that because our subject does not know after the switch that her self-verifying judgment was about water and we have stipulated that she forgot nothing during the relevant stretch of time, she did not know initially that she was thinking about water in spite of the fact that her self-verifying judgment was true.

I don't think (MK) can be used to show what Boghossian thinks it can. Suppose this morning I think to myself that when I utter 'CL thinks that CL thinks and so it must be that CL exists' I utter something that is true. Later, I take a nap on the couch. Suppose that after that some subject, stretched out in just the same spot on my couch where I was earlier, sincerely utters with his eyes closed 'CL thinks that CL thinks and so it must be that CL exists' and thinks that what he has uttered must be true and must be true of him. When this subject tries to open his eyes, he will notice that he cannot see and feel and that his head has been wrapped in bandages. Amy will tell him that earlier, someone took out CL's brain, split it into two, and placed each hemisphere into a new body. One of those bodies, she says, is his body. She tells him that his skull houses half of CL's brain and some newspaper to keep it from moving around too much. The surgeries, she tells him, were both successes and so the subject should be able to remember everything from earlier. The subject who wishes Amy would call him 'CL' says he can remember everything from before a guy known as 'CL' went down for a nap. What the subject does not know, however, after waking is whether the thought he thought just as waking was the thought I thought just before going to sleep. That is because this subject will have the same problem that I do describing splitting cases. (If the guy on the couch after the surgery is me, the nap won't make me that much better at philosophy and if it's not me the surgery won't make the guy with half my brain any better, either.) Just as I do not know whether I will survive this operation, this subject does not know whether (the original) CL survived the operation and so does not know whether in thinking 'CL thinks that CL thinks and so it must be that CL exists' this knowledge concerned the same subject matter as the original thought or not. It hardly seems to follow, however, that before my nap I did not know that what I thought when I uttered those words was true.

Structurally, this case is akin to a slow switching case. The typical case follows this storyline: (i) the subject thinks 'I think water is a liquid' is true and believes what she says (i.e., that water is a liquid); (ii) the subject is surreptitiously switched to Twin Earth; (iii) the subject acquires the concept for twater and comes to express that concept when she uses 'water'; (iv) the subject thinks 'I think water is a liquid' is true and believes what she says (i.e., that twater is a liquid); (v) her odd predicament is revealed at which point she realizes that she does not now know whether her thought at (i) involved the concept for water or twater. At the end of my story, the epistemic predicament of the guy on my couch with half my brain is akin to the predicament of someone at stage (v) in a slow-switching story. Just as it is tempting to say that my ability at the beginning of the story to knowingly determine that my thought is true did not presuppose the ability to later re-identify that thought regardless of what additional information I might acquire between the time of the initial thought and the time I try to re-identify it, it seems that we can say the same for slow-switching cases.

In Chapter 8, 'What the Externalist Can Know Apriori', Boghossian argues that compatibilists who embrace content externalism and privileged access are committed to the absurd view that we could know apriori empirical facts such as the existence of water. It seems that the compatibilist claims that we can know apriori that both of the premises of the following argument are true and that the argument is valid:

(2) If I have the concept of water, then water exists.

(3) I have the concept of water.

(C) Water exists. (p. 180)

An initially promising response to this argument is to say that (2) is true, but it is not something we can know apriori. We can run Twin Earth thought experiments using terms that purport to pick out something (e.g., 'unicorn', 'Santa Claus', 'God', 'Atlantis') we may not believe to pick out anything at all. We can do this by focusing on subjects in our community who believe these terms are non-empty and imagining a different linguistic community in which speakers use these terms to successfully refer to things people in our community do not refer to. That we can run the experiments this way suggests that there is a difference between wide concepts and world-involving concepts. A concept is wide if it is not shared by all of our intrinsic duplicates. A concept is world-involving if possessing it requires that the subject is in some sort of contact with entities that fall under the concept. The concept we associate with 'water' is both wide and world-involving. The concept we associate with 'unicorn' is wide but not world-involving. That we can run Twin Earth examples using wide concepts that are not world-involving suggests that we do not know apriori whether the inference from (2) and (3) to the conclusion is any more sound than it would have been had we substituted 'unicorn' for 'water'.

Boghossian's response to this sort of objection is to say that the externalist who accepts (2) while denying that (2) can be known apriori is committed to the view that the wide concepts that are not world-involving (e.g., the concept speakers associate with 'water' on a dry planet where they believe 'water exists' expresses a truth because of some mass delusion) are not atomic concepts. Boghossian thinks that this is bizarre because he thinks that if the concept we associate with 'water' is atomic, the concept our intrinsic duplicates associate with 'water' should be atomic as well (p. 186). Maybe he is right about this, but it is hard to see why wide concepts that are not world-involving cannot be atomic concepts. It isn't obviously wrong to say that the concept we associate with 'unicorn' is atomic, so it isn't clear why the concept speakers on Dry Earth associate with 'water' cannot be atomic. As important as Boghossian's work on externalism and self-knowledge was in the early debates about the epistemological consequences of content externalism, I am not convinced by the arguments reprinted in Content and Justification that there still is some deep difficulty for externalist accounts of self-knowledge.

While I have focused on the parts of Boghossian's discussion that seemed to me to be particularly problematic, let me close by saying that in spite of an occasional flaw the essays contained in this volume are all excellent, the older essays provide an excellent gateway into debates concerning thought content and self-knowledge, and the newer essays will surely generate literatures of their own in the near future.