Contesting Nietzsche

Placeholder book cover

Christa Davis Acampora, Contesting Nietzsche, University of Chicago Press, 2013, 259pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226923901.

Reviewed by Christopher C. Raymond, Vassar College


"Greek antiquity," wrote Nietzsche in the summer of 1875, "is a means for understanding ourselves, for judging our own age and thereby overcoming it."[1] One aspect of ancient Greek culture that especially sparked his critical imagination was its spirit of competition -- political, athletic, and artistic. Christa Davis Acampora proposes that Nietzsche's reflections on the Greek agon, or contest, provide a framework for understanding the style and substance of his philosophy more broadly. Her wide-ranging study touches upon all the major works, as well as some that are rarely discussed, and engages with key debates in recent Anglophone scholarship. A central task for her is to show how Nietzsche's analysis of the agon suggests fresh answers to well-worn questions. In this review I will provide a summary of Acampora's project while raising doubts about two of its main interpretive claims.

Acampora organizes the bulk of the book around Nietzsche's "contests" with four monumental figures of Western culture: Homer, Socrates, Paul, and Wagner. Her aim is not to offer new readings of his complex (and deeply ambivalent) attitudes toward these figures, but to show how each serves as an archetype, a representative of an ideal or worldview, with whom Nietzsche struggles in the course of his own philosophical formation. Acampora uses this developmental narrative to explore Nietzsche's views on art, knowledge, morality, and agency, which she in turn reads through the lens of the agon. The book's title, it should be noted, refers to a Nietzsche who contests. Occasionally Acampora suggests the need for a critical engagement with his views, but doesn't undertake this task here.

In the Introduction, Acampora gives an overview of Nietzsche's "agonism", a label used at various points to refer to the following: his interest in the contest as a "means for the creation of value" (p. 3); "the constitutive role of struggle and conflict" in his metaphysical and psychological theories (p. 3); and his practice of creating "historical agones to advance his philosophical development and provoke similar contestation for his readers" (p. 8). She suggests that we understand his combative style of writing to be at the service of a higher cultural goal: through his works Nietzsche aims to revive the value-creating activity of agonistic engagement that flourished in Greek antiquity.

In chapter 1 ("Agon as Analytic, Diagnostic, and Antidote"), Acampora sets up her four main studies with a discussion of Nietzsche's early analysis of the Greek agon. Her point of departure is the short essay "Homer's Contest", from the collection of "Five Prefaces to Five Unwritten Books" presented to Cosima Wagner as a Christmas gift in 1872. Its central claim is that the Greeks invented the agon in order to redirect their violent, destructive instincts into culturally productive pursuits. Nietzsche associates the origin of the agon with Hesiod's "good" Eris (Strife), the goddess who inspires individuals with the healthy ambition to outdo others by elevating above them. Before the birth of the agon as an outlet for creative struggle, the Greeks knew only the "bad" Eris and herVernichtungslust -- the "thirst for annihilation" that seeks to destroy the opponent by any means necessary. On Acampora's reading, the significance of the agon for Nietzsche lies above all in its redemptive function: the good Eris "conceptually enabled the ancient Greeks to eventually direct what had been recognized as a source of misery -- the effort required to engage the daily struggle to sustain life -- into a channel that led to pursuit of the highest forms of human possibilities" (p. 19). But Nietzsche does not only value the agon as a path to individual greatness. A successful contest requires a community to establish criteria of excellence, judge according to rules and standards, bear witness to the action, and recognize and celebrate the victor. The broader public therefore also sees itself affirmed in the brilliance of its competitions (Acampora explores this relation of mutual dependence between individual and community through a reading of Pindar's Tenth Olympian Ode). At the same time, the contestants do not seek merely to satisfy the expectations of their audience; they strive to set new standards of excellence, in the light of which future contests will be judged.

This final observation points to the value-creating potential of the contest, which becomes the principal theme of chapter 2 ("Contesting Homer: The Poiesis of Value"). Acampora identifies two main reasons why Nietzsche came to regard Homer as an exemplary agonist. First, in Homer's poetry the pessimistic worldview of an earlier age is transfigured: struggle and conflict, though inescapable, is represented for the first time as a "route to glory" (p. 43). The beauty of heroic sacrifice makes human existence seem more desirable than the lives of the gods, whose very immortality denies them the possibility of such heroism (p. 52). Second, by setting a new standard of poetic achievement, Homer "inspires others to practice the act of transfiguration themselves" (p. 51). The rest of the chapter considers how Nietzsche takes up this challenge in his first book, The Birth of Tragedy out of the Spirit of Music. Acampora presents Nietzsche's theory of tragedy as an attempt to surpass the one-sided Apollinian aesthetics of Homer's art. In the Birth, she argues, tragedy is understood as a contest between the forces of Apollo and Dionysus in which neither side has the ultimate advantage. On her reading, Nietzsche "locates the pleasure and power of aesthetic experience in the maintenance and sustenance of their tense opposition rather than its elimination or transcendence" (p. 76). Here Acampora departs from the majority of interpreters who take the Dionysian to play the predominant role in the effect of tragedy.

The opening chapters demonstrate the importance of "Homer's Contest" for understanding the early Nietzsche. However, I was less persuaded by Acampora's application of the agon framework to themes from his later works. In "Contesting Socrates: Nietzsche's (Artful) Naturalism") she explores Nietzsche's attempt to revitalize the contest between art and science. Acampora reads his agonwith Socrates as principally a struggle over the value of Schein, or "semblance": whereas the Socratic tradition sought freedom from deceptive appearances, Nietzsche undertakes a revaluation ofSchein, which he sees as a pervasive feature of human cognition and even "part of the enterprise of truth" (p. 90). Acampora dubs his alternative conception of philosophy artful naturalism, in order to mark out a kind of inquiry that is mindful of the ways in which practical interests and conceptual structures shape our understanding of the world. In her view, Nietzsche takes his own philosophical practice to have two major advantages over the competition. The first is epistemic:

What is gained for truth in embracing Schein is recognition of the inventiveness of the sense making that occurs in experience. It calls attention to the creative and artful, the productive dimensions of human thinking that help us sort through, organize, and communicate our experiences. (pp. 90-91)

Acampora warns us not to read the "artful" aspect of Nietzsche's naturalism as suggesting a "pernicious relativism" (p. 94). By paying heed to the mind's inventiveness, rather, we can "more critically engage our efforts to make sense of the world around us and our place and possibilities within it" (p. 95). At the same time, Nietzsche aims to restore a good conscience to the poetic side of our nature, and encourage the invention of speculative scientific models that can make life in a post-Christian world seem worth living. This is the evaluative advantage of artful naturalism. The chapter closes with two case studies, the will to power hypothesis (which receives a metaphysical reading) and the model of the soul as a hierarchy of drives. These, Acampora suggests, are examples of how philosophical inquiry might be both "empirically responsible" and life-affirming (p. 98).

One could argue that Acampora's discussion of artful naturalism and its "anticipated reunion of art and science" (p. 95) gives inadequate weight to Nietzsche's persistent doubts about Enlightenment faith in the value of knowledge. There are numerous passages in both the early and later works that suggest he was not so optimistic about the potential for rational inquiry to support an affirmative evaluation of existence (see, e.g., Gay Science, 344; Genealogy III, 24-25).[2] Given the overall theme of her book, it is surprising that Acampora does not say more about the conflict between affirmation and the "will to truth", which seems to play a larger role in Nietzsche's thought than his inchoate (and mostly unpublished) attempts to redirect scientific investigation. It is also not clear how Acampora's reading of his naturalism differs from other recent interpretations, or what naturalism itself involves as a distinct philosophical methodology.[3] She is perhaps right to deny that Nietzsche offers any "broad theoretical account" (p. 95), and she acknowledges "the need to identify the unique features of Nietzsche's naturalism" (p. 107), but the present work makes little progress in this direction, and the reader is left wishing for a more systematic treatment of the issue.

Chapter 4 ("Contesting Paul: Toward an Ethos of Agonism") examines Nietzsche's moral psychology through the lens of his attack on Pauline Christianity. According to Nietzsche's grand narrative, Paul undermines the vital social function of the contest by turning it into a purely personal and spiritual struggle (completing the work Socrates had begun). Although this change opens up new possibilities for agonistic engagement, Nietzsche sees a crucial difference between the archaic Greek and early Christian ideals of struggle. Acampora writes:

The spiritualized contest of Christianity aims at the destruction of the opponent and, thus, is motivated by Vernichtungslust, but it does not even really distinguish foe from friend since it aims at the self-destruction of those over whom the power of faith is exercised just as much as it seeks the destruction of the enemies of Christianity. . . . In short, Nietzsche thinks the Christian agon encourages a form of struggle that disables, enervates, and debilitates those who emulate the exemplar of spiritual struggle that Pauline Christianity depicts. (p. 113)

The Christian agon, moreover, revalues the Homeric view of mortal existence by setting up a standard -- Christ's suffering -- in comparison to which all merely human struggles seem insignificant (pp. 119-120). Acampora reads Nietzsche's contest with Paul as an attempt to transform the internalized agon of Christianity into a new ideal of self-overcoming, which will channel the tensions of the modern soul into "postmoral" forms of human subjectivity.

A central target of Nietzsche's attack on Pauline Christianity is the picture of intentional agency that grounds the concepts of guilt, responsibility, and sin. In the first essay of On the Genealogy of Morality, Nietzsche claims that our habit of separating the "doer" from the "deed" is an error akin to separating lightning from its flash (GM I, 13). Our mistake is to suppose that there is an autonomous self behind our actions, related to them as cause to effects, which could serve as an appropriate object of praise and blame. Acampora maintains that while Nietzsche denies that we are causally responsible for our actions, he does not wish to undermine our sense of agential responsibility altogether. Drawing on a remark in Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Z II, "On the Virtuous"), she proposes a revised picture of responsible agency modeled on the relation of mother to child.

Mothers and their children are not related by way of the mother's intentions. For one's children, one has hopes but not intentions -- one has a longing, desiring for, a wanting something for the child, and this can succeed or fail, it can turn out well or not. (p. 145)

Whereas causal responsibility (particularly for the purposes of accountability and the attribution of praise and blame) looks back to the past, a mother's sense of responsibility for her child is nearly entirely future oriented . . . In other words, the abiding sense of responsibility that a mother has for a child primarily and for the most part stems not from the fact that she caused the child in contributing genetic material and giving birth or in providing the material and cultural conditions that nurture and sustain the child, but from a form of love (and terror) that is given shape in the promise for the future of that child and his or her ultimate independence. (pp. 147-48)

The suggestion is that if we cultivate such an attitude toward our own deeds, we can loosen the grip of Christian morality and its destructive agonism, and embrace more affirmative modes of self-understanding and self-evaluation.

The fifth and final chapter ("Contesting Wagner: How One Becomes What One Is") attempts to give further content to this conception of agency through an analysis of "becoming what one is". (An Afterword provides a helpful review of the book's key claims.) Acampora contrasts Nietzsche's self-presentation in Ecce Homo (EH) with the portrait of Wagner in his early essay Richard Wagner at Bayreuth, which had described the composer's heroic struggles to match his actions to his titanic aspirations. She argues that the later Nietzsche rejects this model in favor of a quite different ideal of self-creation. In EH, he writes that to become what one is requires "selfishness" (Selbstsucht), an instinct for choosing conditions -- "nutrition, place, climate, recreation" -- that will allow one's strongest drives to find their full and unique expression (EH, "Why I Am So Clever", 10; cf. Daybreak, 552). According to Acampora, Nietzsche offers this ideal of selfishness, or "self-preservation" (Selbsterhaltung), as a "ruling thought" to replace the Christian ideal of selflessness (p. 165). One aim of her final chapter is to carve out a middle path between "fatalist" and "self-creationist" readings of Nietzsche's account of agency.[4] While she agrees with the fatalist reading that Nietzsche takes our actions to result from the interplay of unconscious drives, Acampora thinks there is room on his account for the self to influence how those drives are ordered and interact: "Though our constitutions may be determined to a certain extent by the drives we happen to have . . . self-cultivation, Selbstzucht, development, is nevertheless possible by virtue of taking care of ourselves in very basic ways" (p. 168). In addition to the choice of nutrition and climate, one of the most important ways in which we can take care of ourselves is through choosing the right contestants. In Nietzsche's case it was his struggles with Wagner that allowed him to become what he was.

Acampora's account of self-creation is suggestive, but I doubt that the fatalist reading can be so easily avoided. "Becoming what you are," Nietzsche writes in EH "presupposes that you do not have the slightest idea what you are."[5] Acampora takes this to mean that becoming what we are "is not a matter of us having a definite plan, a fixed notion of what we might become, or even sufficient will to bring about an alignment between our ambitions and our actions" (p. 192). Nevertheless, we can help ensure that our human potential isn't squandered by taking care of ourselves in ways that will tap into and organize our creative powers. Yet Nietzsche's point strikes me as far more radical and disconcerting. For even if we could recognize our unique potential, we still would have no idea what conditions (including nutrition and climate) or choices might lead to its realization. With regard to his own case, Nietzsche insists that he had to be mistaken about himself and his true task, and attributes his greatest achievement, the revaluation of values, to "the lengthy, secret work and artistry of my instinct." So while the "rank order" of our drives may not be fixed at birth, whether we order them advantageously is itself, he suggests, a matter of having the right instincts, and not at all under our conscious control. We are left with a picture of the self on which thoughtfulness and deliberation make no positive difference to whether our lives turn out well. Nor, by implication, do reading and reflecting on Nietzsche's books. There is an ironic tension, I suspect, between Ecce Homo's inviting, impersonal subtitle ("How one becomes what one is") and the repeated ich found in its table of contents ("Why I am so wise", "Why I am a destiny", etc.). Nietzsche draws us into his autobiography only to mock our desire to learn from his example.[6]

[1] KSA 8, 6[2]. Translation based on W. Arrowsmith, "Notes for 'We Philologists'," Arion, New Series, Vol. 1, No. 2 (1973/1974), 279-380.

[2] For an excellent discussion of the role of illusion in affirmation, see D. Came, "The Themes of Affirmation and Illusion in The Birth of Tragedy and Beyond," in The Oxford Handbook of Nietzsche, eds. K. Gemes and J. Richardson (Oxford University Press, 2013) 209-25. 

[3] On Nietzsche's naturalism, see B. Leiter, Nietzsche on Morality (Routledge, 2002); M. Clark and D. Dudrick, "The Naturalisms of Beyond Good and Evil," in A Companion to Nietzsche, ed. K. Ansell Pearson (Blackwell, 2006), 148-68. Acampora briefly engages with their views in a pair of footnotes, concluding: "I maintain that Nietzsche does not believe that science or any other area of inquiry offers a value-free perspective, and thus there cannot be a "pure" naturalism as they and others seem to suggest" (p. 223, n. 44). But there is no sustained discussion of the relative advantages (philosophical or exegetical) of "pure" versus "artful" naturalism.

[4] For the "fatalist" reading, see B. Leiter, "The Paradox of Fatalism and Self-Creation in Nietzsche," in Nietzsche, eds. J. Richardson and B. Leiter (Oxford University Press, 2001), 281-321. For the "self-creationist" view, see A. Nehamas' Nietzsche: Life as Literature (Harvard University Press, 1985).

[5]EH, "Why I Am So Clever", 9, in The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, Twilight of the Idols, And Other Writings, eds. A. Ridley and J. Norman (trans.) (Cambridge University Press, 2005).

[6] I am grateful to Chris Sykes for his comments on a draft of this review.