Context and the Attitudes: Meaning in Context, Volume I

Placeholder book cover

Mark Richard, Context and the Attitudes: Meaning in Context, Volume I, Oxford University Press, 2013, 290pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199557950.

Reviewed by Isidora Stojanovic, Universitat Pompeu Fabra


This, the first of the two volumes that compose Mark Richard's Meaning in Context, is a collection of thirteen previously published essays, preceded by a fourteenth, new essay that provides an introduction to the volume and discusses a number of previously unaddressed topics. The essays date from the early 1980's up to the present, the first from 1983 ("Direct Reference and Ascriptions of Belief") and the last from 2011 ("Kripke's Puzzle"), and draw their unity from a common topic, that of attitudes, as indicated by the title. Propositional attitudes, and in particular beliefs, have been one of the core topics of analytic philosophy of language and mind ever since they saw light with the work of Frege and Russell. Yet despite being one of the most discussed topics, they continue to be an area in which controversy abounds. Although the issues raised by propositional attitudes and their ascription, such as the context-sensitivity of belief reports, have lost some of the trendiness that they had in the 1980's and early 1990's (when most of the volume's articles were written), they are still at the heart of ongoing philosophical inquiry and in need of answers now as much as ever. Richard's book thus offers a wonderful opportunity to go back to some of those questions, remind ourselves of some of the debates surrounding them, and tackle again the issues with both the benefit of hindsight and the excitement of a fresh start.

The essays that constitute the present volume fall broadly into two groups: those that deal specifically with ascriptions of propositional attitudes (ch. 2, 4, 5, 6, 7, 8, 13 and 14) and those that deal with closely related yet separate issues, such as Leibniz's Law (ch. 3), the role of Fregean sense for semantics (ch. 9), semantic pretense (ch. 10), intensional transitives (ch. 11), and tensed belief (ch. 12). Most of the essays from the first group anticipate or further elaborate on the account that Richard put forward in his (1990) monograph, Propositional Attitudes, or defend this account against objections subsequently made by Mark Crimmins, Theodore Sider and Scott Soames (chapters 7 and 8). Publishing these essays today gives the reader the occasion of discovering or rediscovering Richard's account, thereby reviving a proposal that might have begun to fall into oblivion. Let us give a brief outline of Richard's account, see how it develops throughout these essays, and close with a couple of issues that, although relevant, have been left unaddressed.

There is more than one way of formulating the problem that attitude ascriptions pose for semantics. The one that comes closest to Frege's original worry is to consider a person who is unaware that two different names have the same bearer and believes different things about the bearer when deploying the different names. Consider Odile, who knows that Mark Twain is the author of The Adventures of Huckleberry Finn but does not know that Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens, hence does not know that Samuel Clemens is the author of that novel. Then to report Odile's beliefs, (1) seems fine, but not (2):

(1) Odile believes that Mark Twain wrote The Adventures of Huckleberry Finn.

(2) Odile believes that Samuel Clemens wrote The Adventures of Huckleberry Finn.

In other words, (1) is intuitively true while (2) is not. Now, if all that the name contributes to the semantics of a belief report is the individual whom it names (as Direct Reference Theory has it), and if all that 'believes' contributes is a two-place relation between the believer and the proposition believed (here, the proposition that Twain, i.e., Clemens, wrote The Adventures of Huckleberry Finn), then given that Twain is Clemens, there seems to be no way for (1) and (2) to diverge in truth value. A different way of formulating the problem is to consider one and the same (unambiguous) sentence that, uttered in different contexts, appears to differ in truth value. In his essay "How I Say What You Think" (ch. 5), Richard describes a scenario in which Odile accepts the sentence "Twain is dead", yet pointing at the picture of Twain, says that she wants to meet him. Now consider the sentence:

(3) Odile believes that Twain is dead.

Is (3) true or false? The right answer seems to be that the truth value of (3) depends on the context. As said by someone who witnessed Odile's acceptance of "Twain is dead", (3) is true, yet as said by someone who saw Odile expressing her desire to meet Twain, (3) is false. Once again, if the content of (3) boils down to expressing a belief relation between Odile and the proposition that Twain is dead, then there can be no such variation in truth value.

The gist of Richard's enterprise is precisely to make room for the observed context-sensitivity of belief reports. In a nutshell, his proposal is that 'believe' and other attitude verbs are indexical. The context-invariant component of the meaning of such verbs is to contribute the corresponding attitude relation (such as, in (1)-(2), Odile's belief relation to the proposition that Twain, i.e., Clemens, wrote The Adventures of Huckleberry Finn, and in (3), to the proposition that Twain, i.e., Clemens, is dead). However, in Richard's view, reporting someone's belief tells us not only what the person believes, but also gives us some idea of how she believes it. The indexical component resides in the latter aspect: it is the context of the belief report that specifies how the reported belief is believed.

Although the term 'indexical' does not get applied to 'believes' until chapter 5 (p. 90), this is the proposal that emerges from the very beginning. The first essay, "Direct Reference and Ascriptions of Belief", already points out that "ascriptions of belief not only imply that a proposition is an object of belief, but that it is believed in a certain way" (p. 27), and cashes out the idea by means of a triadic theory of belief, in which 'believes' expresses a three-place relation between a believer, the proposition believed, and the way in which it is believed. The triadic theory is further pursued in "Attitude Ascriptions, Semantic Theory, and Pragmatic Evidence" (ch. 4): "belief, desire, and so on are three-place relations between an individual, a sentence (which he may, so to speak, believe-true, desire-true, etc.) and a Russellian entity" (p. 72). The assumption that beliefs are mediated by sentences, or at least, sentence-like entities, is an important part of Richard's overall picture and recurs throughout the book. On the other hand, the assumption that 'believe' and other attitude verbs are three-place rather two-place predicates is of lesser importance: thus, e.g., in chapter 5, 'believes' expresses a two-place relation, but one that relates believers not merely to propositions, but rather, to "hybrids which come from fusing sentences and Russellian referents" (p. 84).

It is easy to see how this sort of proposal solves the problem. The divergence in truth value that we seek for the pair (1)-(2) comes from the fact that the use of the name Samuel Clemens in (2) may give rise to a context in which Odile is reported as having a belief that Twain, i.e., Clemens, is the author of The Adventures of Huckleberry Finn, and that her belief is mediated by a sentence that deploys the name 'Samuel Clemens'. Though Odile has the belief itself, her belief is not mediated by any sentence of the sort, hence (2) comes out false. When it comes to accounting for the truth-variability of (3), different contexts may supply different sentence-like mediators for Odile's belief that Twain is dead. As Richard puts it, "What varies across contexts . . . [is] what counts as an acceptable translation of the sentences (in a very broad sense of 'sentence') Odile accepts" (p. 80).

Richard was not the only one to defend an indexical approach to attitude ascriptions at the time. Other proposals along similar lines include the hidden-indexical theory of Crimmins and Perry (1989), Crimmins (1992, 1995), and Schiffer (1992). In the Crimmins-Perry approach, belief reports come with a hidden argument for the mode of presentation under which the reported belief is being held, while in Richard's proposal, as it crystalizes from ch. 5 on, what an ascription of attitude does is, rather, offer a "translation" of some sentence under which the reportee holds the belief she holds, and the context of the report constrains the range of translations that are acceptable. Though the two approaches differ, how important is this difference? That is precisely the question that "Attitudes in Context" (ch. 6) addresses. For one thing, it aims to rebut two objections from Crimmins (1992); for another, it aims to raise a problem for the Crimmins-Perry account. The problem comes from a phenomenon that is tackled in several other essays, and which lies at the heart of chapter 8: propositional quantification. Thus, in chapter 6, Richard is interested in inferences that appear to be logically valid, such as the following:

(4) Whatever Tom doubts Pierre doubts. Tom doubts that London is lovely. ∴ Pierre doubts that London is lovely.

Richard notes that Crimmins and Perry do not say enough in order for us to see how their approach accounts for such inferences, then offers on their behalf a formalization of (4) on which it fails to be valid (p. 120). But it seems to me that the Crimmins-Perry approach has a straightforward handle on (4):

(5) r (Tom doubts p under r → r' (Pierre doubts p under r'). Tom doubts p1 under r1.

∴ r' Pierre doubts p1 under r'.

Richard is worried that on the Perry-Crimmins account, the sentence "Pierre doubts that London is lovely" may be used in reference to some mode of presentation under which Pierre does not doubt it. But the fact that there are contexts in which the sentence may be so used does not imply that there will be a context in which the sentence is indeed so used as it appears in the conclusion of the argument in (4).

Whether or not propositional quantification is indeed a problem for Crimmins and Perry, it appears to be a topic of predilection for Richard, who devotes to it an essay with the same title (ch. 8). Richard extends his proposal from attitude reports to speech reports and invites us to consider inferences like:

(6) Katya said that John described a map. Blair said that John described a map. ∴ There is something that Katya and Blair said.

He defends an objectual account of propositional quantification, against substitutional accounts. On his account, very roughly, propositional quantifiers range over arbitrary sentences, paired with extensional semantic values. The reason for taking the objects over which such quantifiers range to be paired with their semantic values is to prevent the following inferences from coming out valid:

(7) Smiley believes that he is hungry. James believes that he is hungry. ∴ There is something that Smiley and James believe.

Richard observes that (7) "can fail to be valid because of different demonstrata" (p. 142). But it is precisely with cases relevantly similar to (7) that the very enterprise of accounting for logically valid patterns in propositional quantification runs the risk of going awry. For consider:

(8) Smiley said that he was hungry. James said that he was hungry. ∴ There is something that Smiley and James said -- namely, that they were hungry.

(9) Katya believes that it is raining. Blair believes that it is raining. ∴ There is something that Katya and Blair believe -- namely, that it is raining.

By taking propositional quantifiers to range over hybrids that include (something like) syntactic structure as well as semantic values, Richard's account eliminates (8) and (9) from the class of candidates for logically valid inference patterns. In it unclear, however, that there are any robust, non-arbitrary criteria that would set aside cases such as (8) or (9) from cases such as (6). Richard's own strategy is to appeal to intuitions:

Insofar as we have strong intuitions about the logical properties of some portion of a language, we will want our semantic theory to validate these intuitions. When these intuitions are intuitions about formal validity -- and surely we do have such intuitions -- we shall want our semantic theory, all else being equal, to validate our intuitions by showing that the validity of certain arguments can be seen as a formal matter. (p. 118).

However, intuitions about logical validity are often shaky, and when it comes to propositional quantification, the patterns of inferences that we want to view as a matter of logic are yet to be established.

Richard's book is a valuable collection that should be of interest not only to those interested in the semantics of attitude ascriptions, but to any philosopher of language. Most of the essays are written in a clear and engaging style, and even though the first one dates from more than thirty years ago, none of them is outdated. To the contrary, reading them reminds us of the fact that the puzzles to which attitudes give rise, among which Frege's puzzle and Kripke's puzzle, are still awaiting solution.


Crimmins, M. and Perry, J. (1989), "The Prince and the Phone Booth," Journal of Philosophy 86: 685-711.

Crimmins, M. (1992), "Context in the Attitudes", Linguistics and Philosophy 15: 185-98.

--- (1995). "Quasi-singular Propositions: The Semantics of Belief-Reports, II." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 69: 194-209.

Richard, M. (1990). Propositional Attitudes: An Essay on Thoughts and How We Ascribe Them (Cambridge University Press).

Schiffer, S. (1992). "Belief Ascription." Journal of Philosophy 89: 499-521.