Contextualism in Philosophy: Knowledge, Meaning, and Truth

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Gerhard Preyer and Georg Peter (eds.), Contextualism in Philosophy: Knowledge, Meaning, and Truth, Oxford University Press, 2005, 416pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199267413.

Reviewed by Wayne A. Davis, Georgetown University


These essays are all concerned to some degree with the extent to which, and the ways in which, the truth conditions of sentences are context dependent. There is nonetheless little that connects all the essays. The topics range from epistemic contextualism to linguistic compositionality and semantic presupposition. The collection is, however, interesting and profitably read.

In "Contextualism and the New Linguistic Turn in Epistemology," Peter Ludlow surveys the linguistic evidence for and against what I will call "epistemic contextualism," the thesis advocated by Cohen, DeRose, and Lewis that the truth conditions of "S knows p" are dependent on the context of utterance. Ludlow concludes that a good case can be made for the thesis that "S knows p" has an "implicit" standards argument, selected by the context. Of particular importance is Ludlow's discussion of embedding: in the context "A believes that S knows p," "S knows p" conveys A's standards, not the speaker's.

In "The Emperor's New 'Knows'," Kent Bach is mainly concerned with whether epistemic contextualism provides an adequate response to skepticism. Contextualists believe it does, since it allows that while instances of "S knows p" are false in the ultra-high standards contexts of the epistemologist, they are true in the low standards contexts of everyday life. After criticizing the idea that skeptical arguments are persuasive only because people fail to recognize context shifts, Bach argues that contextualism both fails to do justice to skepticism (the skeptic will not concede that "S knows p" is ever true if S lacks conclusive evidence for "p") and concedes too much to skepticism ("S knows p" never requires S to have conclusive evidence for "p"). Bach also suggests that what varies from context to context are not the truth conditions of "S knows p" but "the attributor's threshold of confidence."

In "Knowledge, Context, and the Agent's Point of View," Timothy Williamson provides a careful exposition of epistemic contextualism, indicating some of its strengths. He then argues that if "know" were context-sensitive, that would place a heavy burden on memory. This argument, however, depends on a questionable assumption that remembering information consists in storing sentences; moreover, we seem to cope well with many other context-sensitive terms. Williamson develops another counter-argument based on other debatable premises: that "S is wrong to φ" is not context sensitive, and that S is wrong to believe p iff S does not know p. Finally, Williamson plausibly suggests that the vacillation people display when confronting skepticism may simply be the predictable result of weighing complex and conflicting considerations

In "What Shifts? Thresholds, Standards, or Alternatives?" Jonathan Schaffer investigates what shifts from context to context if contextualism is correct: the threshold of justification, the standard of "epistemic strength," or the range of alternative possibilities. Schaffer argues for the last, using "S regrets p" as a model. He claims that "I regret that Bush is president" is true when the relevant alternative is that Gore is president, but false when the alternative is that Cheney is president. I question this data. I believe the sentence is true in all contexts in which I am the speaker even though "I regret that Bush rather than Cheney is president" is false in all similar contexts.

In "Epistemic Modals in Context," Andy Egan, John Hawthorne, and Brian Weatherson discuss a cousin of epistemic contextualism concerned with epistemic modals, as when Stanley says "Livingston might be in Rhodesia." These seem as context sensitive as knowledge claims. Stanley's claim might be parsed, "For all I (or we) know, Livingston is in Rhodesia." Egan et al. present numerous problems for such a contextualist semantics. For example, Livingston -- who knows full well he is in Kenya -- could not very well say that Stanley spoke truly. They also consider embedding problems, and show that Ludlow's solution is problematic. After rejecting an invariantist solution, Egan et. al. suggest a "relativist" semantics, according to which what Stanley said is (roughly), "For all everyone in C knows, Livingston is in Rhodesia" (152). They then claim that what Stanley said is true relative to Stanley's context and false relative to Livingston's. In general, epistemic modals are true or false only relative to a "context of evaluation." On this view, however, an epistemic modal appears to express an open proposition (with an unbound variable), which is not something that can be believed, nor something that can be true even relative to a context of evaluation. What Egan et. al. call contexts of evaluation look like Kaplanian contexts, which fix a referent (or value for "C") before evaluating for truth in different possible circumstances. If "C" in the gloss is treated as an indexical (e.g. "the contextually indicated context") rather than a variable, then the semantics is contextualist.

In "Literalism and Contextualism: Some Varieties," François Recanati questions the traditional assumption that the meaning and truth conditions of a sentence are determined compositionally by the meanings of the component words. He concludes that "we must stop presupposing that there is such a thing as the minimal proposition expressed by an utterance" (194). Recanati presents a large body of linguistic data and a bewildering array of theories. On some of these theories, the truth conditions of a sentence are always determined at least in part by the context of utterance, or by what the speaker means by uttering the sentence. Recanati observes, for example, that "I would like coffee" may be used to mean that the speaker would like some liquid coffee to drink, or some coffee beans to buy, or some ground coffee as a present, and so on. He questions whether we know what it is for "Harry to cut the sun" to be true independent of a particular context specifying what would count as cutting the sun. Recanati's contextualist theories entail epistemic contextualism as a special case -- and therefore inherit its problems. On one of Recanati's theories, individual words do not even have "conventional, context-independent word meanings" that could determine the meanings or truth conditions of sentences containing them. This would seem to entail that "cut" does not mean "cut," but it is hard to see how that could be true.

In "A Tall Tale: In Defense of Semantic Minimalism and Speech Act Pluralism," Herman Cappelen and Ernest Lepore rebut Recanati's argument that the postulated minimal word meanings "enriched" in particular contexts play no role in communication. They claim that "The only context sensitive expressions are the completely obvious ones ('I', 'here', 'now', 'that', etc., essentially those Kaplan lists in 'Demonstratives' …"(198). They present three tests for context-sensitive expressions that only the obvious ones satisfy. If semantic minimalism is true, then epistemic contextualism is false, and problems for invariantism are problems for Cappelen and Lepore. They also defend the claim that speech act content need not be closely related to semantic content, as irony and metaphor make clear.

Cappelen and Lepore give a spirited defense of minimalism against the objection that comparative adjectives like "tall" are obviously context-sensitive. They maintain that the invariant meaning of this adjective is adequately given by saying that "x is tall" expresses the proposition that x is tall. Speakers can count on this proposition being grasped by hearers in any context, and grasping it is a starting point in interpretation. It is hard to see how "tall" can have an invariant meaning, however, given that "Michael Jordan is tall" may be true in one context (as uttered by a child) and false in another (uttered by a basketball coach). We cannot very well say that the sentence expresses an invariant proposition that is true in one context and false in another. Nor does it seem possible to maintain that the sentence is literally true in both contexts (or false or neither in both).

In "Semantics in Context," Jason Stanley takes on Recanati as well as Cappelen and Lepore by arguing that phenomena such as quantified domain restriction are dependent on linguistically determined content. Why is it, for example, that "Every bottle is in the frig" can be "enriched" to mean "Every bottle in the house is in the frig," but not "Every bottle or can is in the frig"? Stanley shows that objections to taking other interpretation processes as semantic, such as metaphor or deferred reference, do not apply to domain restriction. He recalls and defends his "binding argument," which observes that "In every room, every bottle is in the corner" is most naturally interpreted as meaning "In every room r, every bottle in r is in the corner."

In "Meaning Before Truth," Paul Pietroski argues that theories of meaning are not theories of truth. He claims that proper names like "France" have a meaning but no referent. As a result, axioms like "France" denotes France are either untrue or cannot be understood the way Davidsonians had in mind. Pietroski draws these conclusions because he believes that while "France is hexagonal" and "France is a republic" are both true (as is "France is hexagonal, and it is a republic"), republics are not hexagonal. So no single referent makes both statement true. Nevertheless, this is not an instance of ambiguity (as when "France" is used to refer to the Nobel prize winning novelist). And Pietroski does not go so far as to claim that "France exists" is false (so it is not referentless for the reason "Santa Claus" is). It follows that "the meanings of declarative sentences do not determine truth conditions even relative to contexts" (256).

Pietroski does little to motivate his initial premise except to say that the notion of a hexagonal republic is "weird in a way that calls for explanation" (270), and to ask rhetorically whether the republic of France was formerly a monarchy or could have been a communist state (287). Cartesians similarly made a mystery of the referent of "I" because they thought that "I am thinking" and "I am 5'9" tall" could not both be satisfied by the same object. Was the thinker of my thoughts formerly a fetus? Note that it is not weird to say that some republics are small, that many are in the Northern Hemisphere, and that most were not always republics.

A similarity between "France" and "know" may lie in Pietroski's suggestion that "a name like 'France' provides instructions for accessing one or more singular concepts, which can be used to think about the various things that can count as France" (275).

In "Compositionality and Context," Peter Pagin first examines Fodor's argument that natural language is not compositional because meaning is context dependent. Specifically, Fodor thinks that language cannot be compositional if thoughts can be expressed elliptically or inexplicitly, as illustrated by quantifier domain restriction, as well as by the use of "It is raining" to mean "It is raining here." Pagin then examines Stanley's binding argument against the existence of "unarticulated constituents." Stanley argues that if "It rains" expressed a proposition with an unexpressed location constituent, sentences like "Every time John lights a cigarette, it rains" could not have their most natural interpretation (claiming that it rains wherever John lights the cigarette). After a critique of Recanati's response to Stanley, Pagin attempts to refute Stanley's argument by providing a semantics with unarticulated constituents that provides the natural interpretation. Pagin then argues that compositionality is likely to fail if there are unarticulated constituents, supporting Fodor's argument. "That is, the meanings of all the parts of a complex expression e will be the same in two different contexts c1 and c2, the mode of combination will be the same, and still e will have a different meaning in c1 and c2." (333). I believe this conclusion follows only if the unarticulated constituent in the thought expressed by "It is raining" (or the articulated constituent in "It is raining here") is something like a location reference rather than an indexical concept (or element in the "language of thought," or "sense"). Since the thought constituents expressed by pronouns can be bound by quantifiers, Stanley's binding argument seems inconclusive too.

In "Presuppositions, Truth Values, and Expressing Propositions," Michael Glanzberg examines what he calls "expression failure." He proposes that "it corresponds to the discourse status of obligatory repair, which can be detected by repair tests." After arguing that some but not all presupposition failures lead to expression failure, Pagin sketches an account of elementary presuppositions. Not enough information was provided here for me to understand or assess Glanzberg's proposals. He stipulates that for a proposition to be expressed, "the following must become common ground: a. The proposition encapsulating the information conveyed. b. That the information was to be conveyed by the assertion" (355). Propositions are identified with information (353), but nothing is said about what it is to "convey" information. The "common ground" is defined, following Stalnaker, as all the information "taken for granted" by the participants at a given time in the conversation (354); this is later equated with the "context" at that time (365). Nothing is said about what it is to take a proposition for granted except that it does not entail believing the proposition. It seems to follow from this that once a proposition is taken for granted, it cannot be expressed; but that cannot be right.

Glanzberg gives as a clear example of expression failure the case in which "That palm tree is going to fall" is uttered when "no referent of that palm tree is available in the context"; "there is no salient object"(357). But suppose the speaker thinks he sees a palm tree. Couldn't the other participants in the conversation "take for granted" that the speaker does see a palm tree? In that case, hasn't the speaker added a proposition to the common ground along with the proposition that he conveyed it? Does taking for granted that the speaker thinks there is a palm tree suffice to make a referent for that palm tree available in the context? I could not find the answers to such questions. I also could not tell whether "Santa Claus brought the presents" is another example of expression failure. I found the repair test to be inconclusive. "No, Santa Claus did not bring the presents" and "There is no Santa Claus, so Santa Claus did NOT bring the presents" are both possible responses to "Did Santa Claus bring the presents?"

Finally, Glanzberg gives truth conditions for "It was John who solved the problem" in two ways. The first, using standard quantificational notion (x ∈ Ic [P(x) ↔ x = j], where Ic is the set of contextually salient individuals), entails that the sentence is just false when no one solved the problem, although Glanzberg claims that no proposition is expressed in that case. The second method provides an "update instruction" ("Find an x satisfying P(x) in the context and … "). But being imperatives, instructions are not true or false. So on the second method it is hard to see how any cleft expresses a proposition. If the second method is converted into a truth condition in the most obvious way ("If the instruction is carried out, the object found is j"), then it is equivalent to the first method.