Contextuality in Practical Reason

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A. W. Price, Contextuality in Practical Reason, Oxford University Press, 2008, 208pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199534791.

Reviewed by Tim Henning, Friedrich-Schiller-University Jena


According to the central claim in this new volume by A. W. Price, practical rationality depends on contingent features of an agent's context in ways that are more fundamental than is usually assumed. Price develops a kind of contextualist take on central topics surrounding practical reason, the outlines of which are as follows: As agents, we face complex teleological structures of ends to be achieved, means to avail ourselves of, and side constraints to be respected. These structures vary between contexts and agents, a variation that has truly deep effects on our practical thinking. For what varies with these contextual features is not only the truth values of practical judgments about what an agent ought to do, has reason to do, etc. Rather, it is also the truth conditions, i.e. the contents of such judgments, that are thus sensitive to context. The same holds, according to Price, for the very criteria of validity for practical inferences in a context.

Price's book goes quite some way toward establishing these claims. It brings together the flourishing philosophical topics of context sensitivity and reasoning, and in doing so it provides deep and far-reaching insights into the nature of practical rationality.

As is inevitable, Price leaves open some relevant questions, and some need for clarification remains. More generally, Price's writing is decidedly elaborate, and literary and scholarly references abound. In contrast, the sober "professional" work of figuring out the details of a systematic theory of what Price calls the "contextuality" of practical rationality is, at least to some extent, left to the reader. But, as Price's introduction makes clear, this is due to a deliberate choice of style. And it is not a bad choice, at least in principle. Aristotle famously held that the demand for systematic rigor should be sensitive to the topic, and that in practical matters we had better not overstress its importance. Much of Price's writing is apt to convince the reader of this.

In what follows, I highlight some of the many ideas in the book -- and I indicate a few points at which Price may have taken Aristotle's advice to heart a bit too much.

Price's investigations start with the topic of practical inference. His central claim is that the criteria of validity of practical inferences cannot be captured by universal principles of logic alone. In a number of examples, Price shows that what he calls "practicality" is often not preserved by inferences that do preserve truth values. It is well known, for example, that logics of practical reasoning have trouble explaining why it is not rationally compelling to reason from "I intend that I will φ" to "I intend that I will φ or χ", even though in corresponding theoretical statements disjunction introduction is a valid move. Price adds further problems: For one thing, conjunction elimination is not compelling in practical reasoning either. For it is "[a] practical question whether to form a simple intention to j for the sake of fulfilling the compound intention to φ and χ. What if φ'ing without χ'ing is a very bad idea [ … ]?" (xii) Neither is the set of conditions that we may reasonably intend to bring about in a given context closed under modus ponens. For modus ponens licenses reasoning not only from ends to necessary means, but also from ends to what Price calls "necessary corollaries." Yet reasoning from both "I intend that I get drunk" and "If I get drunk, I will have a hangover" to "I intend that I will have a hangover" surely seems far from compelling.

These are problems that logics of practical inference have long struggled with, as Price points out in discussions of R. Hare's and A. Kenny's approaches. But why is it that, while our standard logical rules seem to be a safe, and indeed mandatory way of rationally forming new beliefs from old ones, the same does not hold for practical attitudes? Price explains it as follows. From D. Velleman, he adopts the idea that intentions are "active" states that are themselves parts of the effective means towards the end that they represent. Therefore, practical inference as a way of forming such intentions "is itself at service of the end to which it seeks to select a means." (22) Consequently, whether an inference makes sense as a way of forming intentions depends on whether it happens to serve the goal, given the contingent teleological structure of the context.

One consequence that Price draws from the above is the falsehood of a thesis he calls "logicism." This, however, is one of the points where the reader is likely to demand more than Price actually offers. For logicism, as understood by Price, is not just the claim that standard logic suffices to capture our criteria for valid practical reasoning; Price has certainly cast doubt on this idea. But Price's denial of logicism is also meant to imply that practical inference is not subject to a distinctive "formal logic of its own." (17)

I fail to see that this has been established. Presumably contemporary logic has more resources on offer than the ones exploited by Hare and Kenny, so Price's pessimism seems a bit hasty. Why should it be impossible to define a connective that intuitively expresses an appropriate means-end relation? Semantic interpretations for a language containing this connective might, for example, employ a suitable function from pairs of contexts (sets of worlds, say) and agents onto sequences of items. These items could serve to represent relevant ends, available means and much else, relative to the agent and context. A logic with some such connective might fare better at licensing only inferences that preserve "practicality", or so it seems. Anyway, no matter how you like this particular sketch: Price has simply not shown that nothing of this kind could be made to work.

Price then turns to judgments containing practical modalities like "ought" and "must." According to him, we can affect what such judgments express in a context by relating them to different ends or constraints that form the teleological structure of the context. This contextualist theory has the most interesting results in connection with conditionals containing "must" and "ought".

Price's discussion of practical conditionals starts with a familiar problem from Hare. Consider these two apparently conflicting conditional "ought"-statements:

(1) If you want to get drunk every night, you ought to work in a bar.

(2) If you want to get drunk every night, you ought not to work in a bar.

Price agrees with Hare that, intuitively, the relation between (1) and (2) "is not one of straightforward inconsistency" (61). So it seems that there must be more to the logical form of at least one of them than meets the eye. Price discusses a popular proposal to the effect that some "ought"s take wide scope over conditionals, and that at least in some such cases it is not possible to 'detach' the consequent of such a conditional by affirming the antecedent. Interpreting either (1) or (2) along these lines will thus avoid inconsistency.

However, as Price shows, it is not easy to understand conditionals thus interpreted. In showing this, he examines at some length J. Broome's influential theory of "normative requirements" (as Broome calls non-detachable wide-scope "ought"-conditionals). Price starts by arguing that many of Broome's examples of requirements are inadequate; he then finds a more plausible way to explain what requirements might express in a proposal by J. Dancy. According to Dancy, requirements should be seen as expressing a ban against certain combinations of acts and attitudes. His example is hypocrisy: We can be sure that it is wrong to φ and to believe that it is wrong for others to φ, even if we are not sure about the correct assessment of this belief and action taken individually. In such a case, we may say "If A believes φ-ing to be wrong for others, he should not φ"; still, if we came to know that A does believe that, we may not conclude that he should not φ. All we may infer is that A should either not φ or stop believing it wrong for others to φ.

So according to the interpretation of requirements that Price finds most plausible, they are subject to a rule of contraposition. But this rule is counterintuitive when applied to most of the conditionals we seek to understand. Taking up Dancy's example, Price points out that our judgments about hypocrisy are too asymmetrical to allow for contraposition; for "[the sincere man] models his words and actions on his thoughts, and not his thoughts on his words and actions" (81). Thus the question is "whether Broome can intelligibly ground the asymmetry without licensing detachment" (83) -- and, according to Price, he cannot.

Price then offers an alternative view of conditional "ought"s, according to which something akin to detachment is in fact permitted, but the Hare-intuition about (1) and (2) can still be respected. Price's strategy is, not surprisingly, a contextualist one.

He starts with detailed proposals as to how the logical form of conditional "ought"-statements is to be represented, to the effect that, among other things, they do not permit contraposition. However, the main result is that such conditionals, rightly understood, allow for what Price labels "quasi-detachment", but only defeasibly. This defeasibility is, at least in part, due to the context sensitivity of "ought." Take again (1), "If you want to get drunk every night, you ought to work in a bar." When we are inclined to accept this rather than (2), we probably understand the antecedent as specifying a goal of the addressee relative to which we evaluate the following ought-statement. And relative to this goal, we can indeed say that it is fitting to work in a bar. Here, detachment is plausible in simply "[matching] an economy of means to an economy of effect." (114)

However, the context can be changed, and different teleological aspects can become salient. Once we know that the addressee wants to get drunk every night, we may start to find other ends more important, such as his health. Given this, we will understand (1) in a different way. We do not take the antecedent to specify the relevant goal relative to which the consequent is to be evaluated; we merely take it as stating a condition. The end relative to which we do evaluate "you ought to work in a bar" is not the fulfillment of the addressee's desire, but his health. Taken this way, we will not detach the consequent of (1) by affirming the antecedent. On the contrary: We may reject (1) altogether and instead affirm (2): "If you want to get drunk every night, you ought not to work in a bar."

So what happens is this: If we come to affirm the antecedent of (1), this may change the context in a way such that the consequent of (1) is not acceptable any longer. We may start to worry about the addressee's health, and this may affect the way in which we evaluate "ought"-statements. This may make it look like detachment is not permitted; but in fact it is as long as the relevant contextual features are not changed on the way.

So here we have a paradigm contextualist solution of a philosophical puzzle, and it surely is an elegant one. However, some questions remain. If Price is right, there are contexts in which conditionals like (1) come out true and are detachable. But then it seems that in such contexts, we can establish that we ought to j simply by forming a desire to do so. This is a version of M. Bratman's so-called "boot-strapping objection." Price's answer is similar to those given by Broome or N. Kolodny: Rational "ought"s and reasons for action "only partly coincide." (115) In particular, requirements of instrumental rationality and consistency are not reasons.

The last part of Price's book presents an account of reasons for action that is supposed to underwrite these claims. One part of the account is a genetic story developed by R. Wollheim. According to this story, there are subtle and reciprocal interactions between desires and reasons in the course of our psychological development; but still, given this development, what reasons we have does not depend on any particular desires of ours. The second part of the account is a contextualist treatment of a certain kind of reason ascription and a corresponding moderate particularist 'metaphysics' of reasons.

However, instead of discussing this account, I propose to use the limited space remaining to focus on the details of Price's contextualism or, to be more accurate, on the fact that there aren't very many details there to discuss.

In several places, Price indicates that he is sympathetic to a thorough-going contextualist semantics for the statements he analyzes; he draws parallels to contextualist semantics in epistemology (cf. 32 and 152), and he even flirts with a "hidden indexical"-version of such a semantics, at least for certain reason-ascriptions (cf. 150). Still, Price does not discuss much linguistic evidence that could ground these claims. In fact, he does not provide any reasons that would count against an invariantist semantics. Such a semantics explains the sensitivity of certain statements pragmatically, by appeal to (what invariantists regard as) an obvious fact: that one and the same statement can be used to say or convey many different things in different contexts without changing its meaning.

One might think that these are questions of mere technical interest, and that Price is to be forgiven for not spending too much time on them. Such an impression, however, would be superficial. After all, Price's book derives a considerable part of its interest from the fact that it attempts to show how fundamental the relativity of practical thought and talk to context is. Now, to most people it would not come as a surprise that certain practical statements can be taken in very different ways, given different circumstances. This, these people may say, is a platitude that is true of almost any old type of sentence. So what special reason is there to suppose that in practical thought and talk, the sensitivity goes deeper and is somehow manifest in the fundamental level of content, thus requiring special attention in philosophical and logical analysis? Seen this way, technical details turn out to make quite a difference for Price's project, and his assurances that, e.g., "the very sense" of a kind of reason ascription "becomes a function of its context" (150) do carry some of the book's philosophical bite.

Thus, Price may not have done everything that needs to be done to defend his claims. Nevertheless, the ideas in this book are bound to fascinate anyone working in the field, and to give direction to future research that will certainly prove to be most exciting. It is these stimulating ideas that make this book a very rewarding read.