Contextualizing Knowledge

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Jonathan Jenkins Ichikawa, Contextualizing Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2017, 288pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682706.

Reviewed by Bernhard Salow, Trinity College Cambridge


Epistemic contextualism holds that "know" picks out different relations when uttered in different contexts. The "knowledge first" program maintains that phenomena such as evidence, justification, warranted assertion, or rational action should be understood in terms of knowledge. The thesis of this book is that these two ideas are compatible, even mutually supporting. Along the way to defending this thesis, Ichikawa offers new and interesting accounts of counterfactuals, evidence, justification, the epistemic norms governing action and assertion, and the nature of belief; clarifies a host of issues surrounding epistemic contextualism; and makes important contributions to the debate about epistemic internalism.

Chapter 1 lays out Ichikawa's preferred version of contextualism about "know". Being careless about use and mention (which Ichikawa is more scrupulous about), the view is:

S knows that p iff S has evidence E such that (i) S has a belief that p which is properly based on E and (ii) all the relevant E cases are p cases. (p.25)

This is contextualist because which cases are relevant depends, in part, on the context in which "S knows that p" was uttered: more cases will usually be relevant when the sentence is used in a sceptical context in which more possibilities are considered than when it is used in a trusting context in which many of those possibilities are ignored.

Chapter 2 develops a theory of counterfactuals, which connects with the analysis of knowledge; since this is a slight detour, I will skip it here.

Chapter 3 discusses evidence, a notion featured in the account of knowledge. Surprisingly, Ichikawa combines his analysis with the "knowledge first" idea that E=K, that someone's evidence consists in all and only the claims they know (or rather that in every context, "someone's evidence consists in all and only the claims they know" expresses a truth.) This does not trivialize the analysis: it now says that a proposition is known if it is either basic knowledge (a belief which is both knowledge and properly based in itself) or else based on some other knowledge (and hence, ultimately, on some basic knowledge) which entails it across relevant cases. "Basic knowledge", moreover, is context-invariant, and we can give an independent account of what it consists in. Ichikawa considers two options: a Cartesian account on which it consists in certain facts about one's phenomenal state, and a disjunctivist account, on which it consists in beliefs formed through the successful exercise of perceptual abilities; he slightly favours the second, less familiar kind, and shows that it retains many of contextualism's advantages.

Chapters 4-6 were, for me, the highlight of the book. They offer accounts of justified belief, having a reason for action, and warranted assertion, all in knowledge-theoretic terms. While each of the accounts is new and creative in its own way, there is a unifying thread: unlike most "knowledge first" approaches to these phenomena, Ichikawa's proposals all respect internalist intuitions.

Consider Ingo, who has formed the belief that it's 3pm, by reading an ordinarily reliable clock -- which, as it happens, is currently stopped. And compare Noah, who did the same, but with a clock that was still running. Ingo doesn't know that it's 3pm, while Noah does. On many "knowledge first" accounts, this difference amplifies: Noah's, but not Ingo's, belief that it's 3pm is justified; Noah, but not Ingo, has warrant to assert that it's 3pm; that it's 3pm is amongst Noah's, but not Ingo's, reasons for action, so that different decisions might be rational for them. These consequences can feel like externalism run amok.

Chapters 4-6 offer interesting, and novel, alternatives. Chapter 4 develops a theory of justification:

S's belief that p is justified iff there is a possible individual alike to S with respect to all relevant basic evidence and cognitive processing, whose corresponding belief is knowledge. (p.115)

So, Ingo is justified after all -- as witnessed by Noah, a knower who shares Ingo's relevant basic evidence and cognitive processing. More generally, if one of a pair of internal duplicates (duplicates in terms of basic evidence and processing) is justified in believing something, so is the other.

Chapter 5 addresses reasons for action, taking a different approach. Ichikawa accepts that Ingo and Noah have different reasons; but he argues that their reasons rationalize the same actions, and that this captures all the probative intuitions. Why would Ingo's reasons support the same actions as Noah's? Because, while Ingo fails to know that it's 3pm, he knows nearby facts which support the same actions -- say, that the clock reads 3pm and it usually gets it right. More generally, Ichikawa conjectures (p.170), the correct theory of which actions are supported by which reasons may entail that the knowledge had by internal duplicates always support the same actions.

This conjecture, unfortunately, faces pressure from the fact that Ingo's "back-up" reasons seem ever so slightly weaker than Noah's "original" ones. So, if Noah's reasons only just rationalize an action whose success depends upon it being 3pm, Ingo's may fail to do the same. Ichikawa constructs cases illustrating this problem, and floats a contextualist response; which he, however, fails to endorse. As an alternative, he suggests (p.181) retracting the conjecture, and instead severing the connection between what one's reasons support and what one ought to do; the latter can then be fixed by one's basic knowledge, hence one's internal state, even if the former is not.

Chapter 6 discusses warranted assertion, again addressing the Ingo/Noah challenge (although, this time, Ichikawa does not motivate his proposal that way). His idea uses the notion of a context's presuppositions -- the claims which the speakers are taking for granted:

S's assertion that p made in context C is warranted iff S stands in the knowledge-relation to p relative to the set of possibilities compatible with C's presuppositions; that is (i) S has a belief that p which is properly based in some of her evidence E and (ii) all the E cases consistent with C's presuppositions are p cases. (p.210)

I don't think this proposal is quite right. For the proposal is made in an ordinary, non-sceptical context. In such a context "Noah's evidence includes the fact that it's 3pm" expresses a truth. But now suppose Noah deduces some other claim from this evidence -- say, that it's after 2:45pm. Then Noah will, even when he is in a sceptical context where it's not presupposed that the clock is running as normal, be entitled to assert "it's after 2:45pm"; for this belief is true in every possibility in which it's 3pm, and that it's 3pm is the evidence he based it on. This is not what Ichikawa intended. Note also that Noah will not be entitled to assert "it's 3pm"; for that belief is based only on things -- e.g. that the clock reads 3pm -- which fail to entail it across the possibilities consistent with the presuppositions of the sceptical context. But it's absurd to think that Noah has warrant to assert "it's after 2:45pm" but not "it's 3pm", given the details of our story. The problem is easily fixed by inserting "basic" in front of "evidence" in clause (i) above, since that it's 3pm isn't part of Noah's basic evidence; and those things which are part of his basic evidence -- e.g. that the clock reads 3pm -- don't entail the truth of his belief that it's after 2:45pm across the possibilities consistent with the presuppositions of the sceptical context. Corrected in this way, the account predicts that internal duplicates in identical contexts have warrant to make all the same assertions. When in a context that presupposes that the clock is working, Ingo and Noah are both licensed to assert that it's 3pm; when in a context that doesn't presuppose this, neither is.

Finally, chapter 7 develops a contextualist account of belief (or "full belief"):

S believes that p iff S rejects every relevant not-p possibility. (pp.229, 234)

Which possibilities are relevant varies with context (belief-relevance and knowledge-relevance don't always coincide); and rejecting a possibility is a more basic attitude than belief, one you take when you categorically rule out a possibility.

Summarized like this, this volume is a series of individual discussions, united only by loose connections in their topics and some of the philosophical resources they employ. Ichikawa presents it differently: as an extended defence of the thesis that epistemic contextualism and the "knowledge first" program are compatible. But I think mine is the right way to present it, for two reasons. First, because the individual proposals are well worth discussing even if, like me, one is unconvinced by Ichikawa's attempt to use them in defence of his main thesis; second, because the book often leaves unclear how the different proposals fit together. Let me expand on both.

In Ichikawa's presentation, the proposals are united by their ability to respond to an influential style of argument that contextualism and the "knowledge first" program make a poor combination. Consider a simple knowledge norm; say, that one is warranted in asserting only what one knows. And consider two speakers in different contexts, thinking about S's assertion that p. Because of the difference in context, speaker 1 can truly say "S knows that p" while speaker 2 can truly say "S doesn't know that p". Using the knowledge norm of assertion, speaker 1 infers "S's assertion was warranted" while speaker 2 infers "S's assertion was unwarranted". We don't want the normative notion ("unwarranted" in this case) to come out context-sensitive, as that would dilute its normative force. So, we need the conclusions to disagree: one of the two has to be wrong. But how, when both were inferred only from truths?

Ichikawa gives different answers, depending on the notion at issue. If the speakers are assessing beliefs for justification, their apparently conflicting conclusions of "S's belief is justified" and "S's belief is unjustified" won't disagree -- "justification", like "knowledge", is context-sensitive. If the speakers are assessing actions or assertions, the correct norm won't licence apparently conflicting conclusions from the two speakers, since what S should do and assert is determined by context-invariant facts about her basic evidence (and, in the latter case, the context she finds herself in). If the speakers are assessing whether S's belief falls short of its "aim" (a property discussed in ch.7), their apparently contradictory conclusions "S's belief that p achieves its aim" and "S's belief that p falls short of its aim" fail once more to disagree; but because this is due to context-sensitivity in "believe" rather than "aim", the normative notion remains undiluted.

I found these reconciliations slightly disappointing. The treatment of justification simply bites the bullet, accepting that "justification" is context-sensitive and hence lacks the relevant normative "oomph". The treatment of action and assertion essentially bypasses the context-sensitive notion of "knowledge" and proceeds in terms of the context-invariant notion of "basic knowledge". This is more interesting, but it effectively abandons the "knowledge first" program, conceding that knowledge -- unlike basic knowledge -- is not so important after all. (Ichikawa claims (p.182) that knowledge still enjoys relative priority here; but I don't see why, since there is no obvious sense in which the analysis of "warranted assertion" or "rational action" in terms of basic knowledge goes through knowledge along the way -- especially if we take Ichikawa's "back-up" option of disconnecting "ought" from "reasons" when discussing actions, and modify the norm of assertion in the way I suggested above.) The treatment of the aim of belief is more satisfying; but, as Ichikawa recognizes, that strategy has limited scope, since we eventually hit phenomena (such as what S did, or what S asserted) that don't depend on context.

The second reason why I struggle to find more unity in the book is more straightforward: the book often leaves unclear how the ideas it develops fit together. For example, suppose Ichikawa's original account of rational action is successful, because reasons constituted by non-basic knowledge never make a difference to what you should do. Then it is tempting to apply that same approach to justified belief: instead of opting for Ichikawa's account, why not say that a belief is justified if it is supported by your evidence, and then appeal to the redundancy of non-basic evidence to reconcile this with internalism and respond to the disagreement problem discussed above? On the flipside, if we have a knowledge-theoretic account of justified belief, why wouldn't we (even as "knowledge firsters") use this in our accounts of action or assertion? Ichikawa does not address these questions; but if he were putting the various proposals forward as parts of a unified view, he really should. In a similar vein, I was unclear about how chapters 4 and 7 fit together. It's tempting to think that they must interact: "justified belief" and "belief" are surely not orthogonal topics. But neither chapter acknowledges the other, so no interactions are addressed.

A final observation, this time about style as much as substance. The book engages with the extensive literature on both contextualism and the "knowledge first" program very explicitly and in great depth (chapter 6 has subsections entitled "De Rose 2002" and "De Rose 2009"), resulting in numerous detours and asides. Thankfully, Ichikawa writes very clearly, and explains the literature in sufficient detail that each detour can be followed. This means that there are benefits to his approach: if you're not embedded in the literature, reading the book will bring you up to date; and if you are, you won't have to work too hard to find out what Ichikawa would say about your favourite issue (and what he says in these detours is always worth considering, and often exactly right). But there are also costs. For with all the detours, it's easy to lose the main thread, and the most interesting ideas sometimes don't begin to surface until two-thirds through a chapter. Even when they do surface, they are often put forward rather tentatively, making them harder to distinguish from ideas raised only to reject or set aside. Experienced readers should be fine -- but advanced undergraduates, and even some graduate students, may need additional guidance on which sections of a chapter to focus on. Given that Ichikawa's writing is so clear and accessible in other respects, this feels like a missed opportunity.

I have harped on about the book's shortcomings, especially its lack of a convincing unifying thread. So, lest I give the wrong impression, let me close by saying that I thoroughly enjoyed the book, and learned much from reading it. It is filled to the brim with important clarifications, convincing objections, and creative proposals on each of the many topics it touches on. Perhaps the whole is, in this case, not much greater than the parts -- but when the parts are great, who cares?


Thanks to Kevin Dorst, Rachel Fraser, and Ginger Schultheis for comments and discussion.