Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos

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Peter E. Gordon, Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos, Harvard University Press, 2010, 426pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674047136.

Reviewed by Hans Sluga, University of California, Berkeley


In 2003, Peter Gordon, Professor of History at Harvard University, published a remarkable book on the kinship between two distinctive figures of Weimar culture: the German Jewish philosopher, theologian, and mystic Franz Rosenzweig and the famed author of Being and Time, Martin Heidegger. The inspiration for this book had come from a short piece Rosenzweig had written on a momentous philosophical debate between Heidegger and his colleague Ernst Cassirer that had taken place at Davos, Switzerland, in 1929 in front of a large international audience. Gordon's new book, Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos, deals directly with this encounter -- with its content, its setting, its antecedents, consequences, and implications. The book can usefully be read as a sequel to Gordon's earlier work, for the two books together draw an extraordinary picture of a unique moment in the history of twentieth-century German philosophy and culture.

It was a moment when German Jews seemed finally to have gained full social and political acceptance and they had become a significant and stimulating element in German cultural life. Cassirer's career as a professor of philosophy at Hamburg and then as rector of that University and as the consummate interpreter of the Kantian tradition testifies to this fact. But it was also a moment at which German nationalism was taking a new ugly turn and the ever-present anti-Semitism was becoming newly virulent. Soon the fertile German-Jewish symbiosis was to come to an end. Rosenzweig died in late 1929 before the Nazis gained power and Cassirer himself was forced to seek refuge in England, Sweden, and finally the United States, where he died as a professor at Yale University in 1945, just as the Nazi terror was reaching an end. Heidegger, on the other hand, compromised himself in 1933 by becoming the first Nazi rector of Freiburg University.

Gordon begins his book with a broad characterization of Cassirer's and Heidegger's philosophical positions. At the core of their debate at Davos (and, it turns out, at the core of their entire philosophical thought) lay, as Gordon puts it, "a fundamental contest between two normative images of humanity," (p. 6) a contest "between thrownness and spontaneity" (p. 7). Where neo-Kantian Cassirer saw human beings as gifted with a capacity for "spontaneous self-expression" and thus endowed with "a complete freedom" to create worlds of meaning, Heidegger envisaged them to be determined by their "finitude" and thus as living in the midst of conditions they have not created and cannot hope to control. These are certainly important categories for characterizing Cassirer's and Heidegger's work. But, it must be added, philosophical systems tend to be amalgams generated from many components derived from multiple sources. Thus, Cassirer's historical narratives committed him to some kind of recognition of human finitude while Heidegger's preoccupation with the possibility of making authentic choices led him in 1933 to celebrate the "will to power" of Germany's Nazi youth.

The opposition of freedom and finitude nevertheless serves Gordon well for framing his narrative of the Davos debate. Having given a broad first outline of Cassirer's and Heidegger's respective positions, he proceeds in his first chapter to analyze the situation of German philosophy at the time of the Davos encounter. German philosophy, he argues, saw itself at this moment in a state of crisis that reflected the political and intellectual uncertainties of the period. Neo-Kantianism had dominated the German philosophical scene for two generations or more, but by the 1920s deep divisions were becoming evident in this school of thought. Existential modes of philosophizing due to Kierkegaard and Nietzsche were at the same time making themselves increasingly felt; philosophical anthropology pointed philosophy in a new direction; and finally there was Edmund Husserl and his school. Heidegger's Being and Time, which had put him at the center of German philosophy in 1927, readily incorporated all these new forces. Cassirer, with more difficulty, also strove to accommodate these new energies by turning Kant's epistemology into a historically and ethnologically oriented philosophy of symbolic forms.

Gordon's second chapter describes the setting of Cassirer's and Heidegger's 1929 debate. The community of Davos, Switzerland, had started in the late 1920s to run yearly University seminars lasting some three weeks each. In 1929, several hundred participants came to the event from all over Europe. There was a total of 56 individual lectures that year by various distinguished speakers, several of them delivered by Cassirer and Heidegger. Gordon's third chapter discusses their lectures in some detail. Cassirer's concentrated on a critique of philosophical anthropology and specifically of Max Scheler's version of this new trend. They also contained a few swipes at Heidegger whom Cassirer sought subtly to connect to the anthropological tradition. Heidegger, in turn, criticized the neo-Kantian interpretation of Kant which, he said, had reduced the first Critique to a theory of knowledge for the natural sciences when it should in fact be read as laying the groundwork of a metaphysics -- a somewhat contentious claim that Heidegger would elaborate in his book Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, published in late 1929.

Heidegger's provocative thesis was also to form the basis of the debate between him and Cassirer, which was the recognized high point of the entire 1929 seminar sessions at Davos. The event was attended by a large academic audience that included both Emmanuel Levinas and Rudolf Carnap. Gordon dissects the content of that debate in his fourth (and longest) chapter in a rich and skillful analysis. He reproduces the entire transcript of the event composed at the time by two younger German philosophers, interspersed with his own perceptive comments. Cassirer had begun the debate with the question: "What does Heidegger understand by neo-Kantianism?" And Heidegger responded by forcefully restating his view that the neo-Kantian philosophers "were united in the conviction that, given the apparent supremacy of the natural sciences, the sole task left for philosophy was to furnish a theoretical ground-work for natural scientific knowledge." (p. 139) The debate moved from there to the topic of the importance of the transcendental imagination to Kant's critical philosophy -- on which Cassirer and Heidegger could find some common ground -- and on to the question of objectivity. Cassirer questioned whether Heidegger, with his belief in human finitude, could have any place for non-relative truth and objective knowledge. Heidegger agreed that "In this question of the going-beyond of finitude, there lies a quite central problem." (p. 166) But he insisted, "What is redeemable here as objective knowledge has, according to the respective, factical, individual existence, a truth-content, which, as content, says something about the being." (p. 171) While Cassirer granted that "man cannot make the leap from his own finitude into a realistic infinitude," he also held with the poet Schiller that from man's spiritual realm "flows forth to him -- Infinity." (p. 183) All in all, it is clear that the debate left both men unmoved in their initial convictions.

In chapter 5 Gordon turns the clock back and asks by what route Cassirer and Heidegger had reached the Davos debate, and we discover that they had had a series of productive interactions before that event. In chapter 6 Gordon jumps forward from the debate and traces the subsequent course of Cassirer's and Heidegger's thought and lives. Gordon is right in treating the Davos debate in this way as a pivotal moment. Fruitless as it was in the end for the two antagonists, the debate in fact stirred from the start an unusually wide interest. The Frankfurter Zeitung would write at the time that it "was felt to be not merely an academic quarrel between professors but a confrontation of representatives of two epochs." (p. 214) Because of the diverging paths of Cassirer's and Heidegger's lives after the debate, the event has since come to be seen widely as a battle between a cosmopolitan liberal humanism and an emerging nationalistic irrationalism. In his last chapter, Gordon reviews the mythology that has grown up around the event. We can see from it that his careful, informed, and scholarly analyses are meant, above all, to demythologize the debate and to return it to its proper philosophical level in the context of its time. In Gordon's final judgment, "the ultimate tragedy of the Davos encounter is not that it ended in victory for politics of the wrong kind. The deeper tragedy is that it ended in politics at all." (p. 357)

Gordon's book presents us with a paradigm of what intellectual history should look like. Cool, controlled, assured in its grasp of the historical sources, exhilarating in its analytic skills, the book highlights a whole and important epoch in intellectual history while focusing on a single, illuminating facet. For philosophical readers, Continental Divide as well as Gordon's earlier book are likely to prove of interest primarily because of what they say about Heidegger, his thought, his life, and his times. Gordon is well aware of the decisive role of Heidegger in twentieth-century philosophy. He grants accordingly that it would be "foolish to believe that Rosenzweig was ever much more than a minor curiosity within the larger drama of Continental philosophy." (p. xi) Cassirer was certainly much more than that, but even he no longer holds the interest that philosophers still find in the work of Heidegger. Here is, perhaps, a place to disagree with Gordon's assessment. He takes Cassirer to have been "indisputably" one of the greatest philosophers of the twentieth century and, even more volubly, "one of the greatest philosophers and intellectual historians to emerge from the cultural ferment of modern Germany." (p. 11) This I find difficult to accept. Cassirer was no doubt an accomplished philosopher, an influential teacher, and above all a thoroughly decent and admirable human being, but he does not get close in stature to the much more problematic Heidegger, and he certainly also lacks the philosophical radicalism of a Wittgenstein, Foucault, or Derrida and the incisive scientific acumen of a Russell, Quine, or Rawls. Attempts to revive his fortunes are, I am afraid, doomed to failure.