Continental Philosophy of Social Science: Hermeneutics, Genealogy, and Critical Theory from Greece to the Twenty-First Century

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Yvonne Sherratt, Continental Philosophy of Social Science: Hermeneutics, Genealogy, and Critical Theory from Greece to the Twenty-First Century, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 237pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521670985.

Reviewed by Robert Piercey, Campion College at the University of Regina


This ambitious and wide-ranging book asks what recent continental philosophy can contribute to our understanding of the social sciences. Yvonne Sherratt argues that continental thought since the late nineteenth century offers a distinctive way of reflecting on social science. She sets out to explain what is unique about the continental approach, to distinguish its main strands, and to show that it is a promising alternative to Anglo-American work in the field. Sherratt's subject is important, and a discussion of it is long overdue. Unfortunately, Sherratt's book is not as original or as well-informed as the topic warrants.

Sherratt's starting point is her observation that while much has been written on the relevance of continental thought for nearly every branch of philosophy, almost nothing has been said about its importance for the philosophy of social science. She points out that there is "no single English language book" (1) on the topic. This neglect is unfortunate, since Sherratt finds most Anglo-American philosophy of social science unsatisfactory. It tends, she claims, to be insufficiently critical of science, often borrowing its agenda and vocabulary from the natural sciences. It also tends to be reductive and foundationalist. Continental thought offers a rich alternative, one that is distinguished by its humanism. Sherratt uses this term to denote an approach to knowledge that originates in ancient Greece and that, so she claims, has been cultivated by recent continental philosophers. Humanism has three defining features. First, it is classically-minded: it "entails being in touch with the ideas and texts of our Ancient ancestors, the Greeks and Romans" (9). The questions a humanist asks about society are as likely to come from Plato or Cicero as from Hempel or Kuhn. Second, humanism maintains that "knowledge works through transmission" (9). Humanists equate epistemic progress with "the accumulation of the knowledge of the past, not the transcendence or destruction of it" (9). Finally, humanists see the world as inherently meaningful -- as "an intrinsically purpose-laden, ethically, aesthetically, and spiritually valuable entity" (9). Sherratt argues that the humanism of recent continental thought leads it to reflect on social science in a distinctive way. It is preoccupied with the meanings of social phenomena, and with the ways in which these meanings are constituted by human actions and power relations. It also takes history seriously, and claims that understanding a social phenomenon often requires us to trace its development through time.

Sherratt divides continental philosophy of social science into three traditions. The first is a hermeneutical tradition originating in ancient rhetoric and medieval biblical interpretation. For this tradition, the notions of meaning and interpretation are central: understanding a social phenomenon is a matter of approaching it as a text and uncovering its true significance. There is also a genealogical approach that originates in Nietzsche's work but finds fuller expression in the writings of Michel Foucault. More subversive than hermeneutics, genealogy traces the histories of cultural artifacts in order to "de-legitimize many of our assumptions about our heritage" (119). Sherratt's final tradition is the critical theory of the Frankfurt School. This tradition engages in a politically sensitive analysis of social institutions, academic disciplines, and works of art, with the goal of showing how they fail to live up to their own aims.

While Sherratt's three traditions include some of the most important continental work on social science, there are some surprising omissions. Merleau-Ponty is not mentioned, despite his voluminous work on psychology, linguistics, and other social sciences. Sartre is not mentioned either, notwithstanding his subtle and original analyses of social phenomena in the Critique of Dialectical Reason. Phenomenology and existentialism are discussed only as influences on the hermeneutical philosophies of Heidegger and Gadamer. Poststructuralist thought is largely ignored, despite its concern with the human sciences and its influence on literary criticism, sociology, and critical legal studies. Those poststructuralists who do appear are presented in unfamiliar guise: Derrida, for example, is described as a member of the hermeneutical tradition, despite his well-known criticisms of this type of philosophy.[1]

Sherratt organizes her discussion historically. She surveys the development of each tradition, listing its major members and giving brief summaries of their views. These summaries often take the form of charts and tables: the book is full of diagrams laying out, for example, the four main differences between Gadamerian hermeneutics and "science" (95), or the five essential features of Foucault's disciplinary regime (164). Sherratt's heavy reliance on exposition has advantages and disadvantages. The advantage is that the book offers a comprehensive survey of three sprawling traditions, a survey that could prove helpful to neophytes and that might make it suitable as a textbook. The disadvantage is that Sherratt often covers well-trodden ground. There are many excellent books summarizing the views of Gadamer, Nietzsche, and Adorno, and it is often unclear what Sherratt has to say about these figures that has not been said before. This problem is compounded by Sherratt's heavy dependence on recent secondary literature. She repeats the claims of other scholars more often than she advances new theses of her own.

Part One, which takes up almost half the book, discusses the hermeneutical approach to social science. This approach treats cultural artifacts as texts to be interpreted, and insists that the interpretation at issue here is quite different from the kinds of thinking found in the natural sciences. Sherratt traces the development of hermeneutics back to ancient Greek and Roman rhetoric, noting how the practice of interpretation changed during the middle ages, the reformation, and the enlightenment. She makes a number of interesting observations about this history. Echoing recent work by Kathy Eden,[2] she claims that Roman rhetoric shaped hermeneutics more than is usually recognized. She also attributes its concern with correctness in interpretation to the reformation: "having relinquished the absolute authority of the Church," she argues, "Calvin needed to find a new source of objectivity in faith" (47). Finally, Sherratt advances some interesting criticisms of Gadamerian hermeneutics. Like Habermas, she is troubled by its insistence that every aspect of human experience is mediated by interpretation. If there is nothing outside interpretation, she argues, then there is no way to identify the ways in which interpretation is distorted by ideology and power relations.

Despite these strengths, the impression one takes away from Part One is of something that has been done before, and done better. The story of hermeneutics has been told many times, and Sherratt seems to have little new to say about it. Her history also shies away from primary texts. The chapter on ancient hermeneutics, for example, cites Aristotle only twice and Plato three times; most of its references are to secondary texts by Richard Palmer and Kurt Mueller-Vollmer. Even Sherratt's engagement with the secondary literature is not particularly thorough. She downplays the importance of ancient Greek thought for the hermeneutical tradition (29), but does not cite P. Christopher Smith's Hermeneutics of Original Argument, an important recent book that challenges her view. As for more recent figures, Sherratt's reading of Gadamer is basically accurate, but her treatment of other figures is not. I have already mentioned her misleading characterization of Derrida as a hermeneutical philosopher. Equally misleading is her portrayal of Derrida as a sceptic, someone for whom "total undecidability reigns. Interpretation is, in fact, impossible" (108). Careful readers of Derrida have long rejected this view, as did Derrida himself.[3] Sherratt's discussion of Paul Ricoeur is also inaccurate. She claims that his contribution was to bring "structuralist thought into the humanist tradition" (101). This is quite misleading: while Ricoeur did try to learn from structuralism, he was hardly a straightforward appropriator of it, as texts such as "Structure and Hermeneutics" show.[4] Nor was his engagement with structuralism his most important contribution to the topics Sherratt discusses. His work on religious symbols, metaphor, and narrative have had tremendous influence on both hermeneutical philosophers and social scientists, but Sherratt does not mention them.

Part Two considers the tradition of genealogy. This tradition studies society in the way that Nietzsche studies morality in the Genealogy of Morals. It traces the hidden histories of our institutions and practices, revealing them to be the contingent products of power struggles, and thereby helping to break their spell over us. After a brief look at Nietzsche's views, Sherratt turns to his "best-ever student" (143), Foucault. She looks to essays such as "Truth and Power" and "Nietzsche, Genealogy, History" to find Foucault's "theory of genealogy" (143). She then describes how Foucault applies this theory in Discipline and Punish and The History of Sexuality. Like Part One, Part Two is heavily expository, giving short summaries of some well-known texts. When Sherratt veers away from exegesis, the results are mixed. She makes some very unclear remarks about Nietzsche, describing him as a "nominalist" who rejects "essentialism" and who argues that "[w]e cannot define items but only describe them" (132). Surely there is a better way to put this: the term most often opposed to 'nominalism' is 'realism,' not 'essentialism,' and the distinction between definition and description is far from Nietzsche's main concern. Sherratt's account of Foucault is largely accurate, though she makes the common mistake of reading "Nietzsche, Genealogy, History" as a presentation of Foucault's own theory of genealogy. As Gary Gutting and others have pointed out, this essay does not give Foucault's own position, but merely describes what he takes to be Nietzsche's view.[5] Finally, Sherratt's claim that genealogy is a form of humanism raises a number of problems. Genealogy certainly shares some things with humanism, such as a concern with the meanings constructed by human beings. But what about Sherratt's claim that humanism sees knowledge as transmitted through the ages by the movement of tradition? For Nietzsche and Foucault, tradition is anything but a transmission of wisdom from our ancestors. They seek to shake our faith in tradition, not kindle our respect for it.

Part Three, which deals with critical theory, is the strongest part of the book, and the part best supported by primary texts. After a brief discussion of how the concerns of the Frankfurt school emerge from the work of Kant, Hegel, and Marx, Sherratt discusses two of its key texts -- Dialectic of Enlightenment and Negative Dialectics -- as well as several books by Habermas. She claims that the value of critical theory lies in its ability to criticize institutions by pointing out gaps between their "internal aims" (200) and what they actually accomplish. The choice of topics and texts in Part Three is somewhat idiosyncratic, given Sherratt's interests. She discusses Negative Dialectics but not Adorno's aesthetic writings, which would have helped highlight the humanism in critical theory. Similarly, she discusses Habermas's Structural Transformations of the Public Sphere but not Between Facts and Norms, despite the latter's tremendous impact on legal theory and other social sciences.

We should be glad that someone has written a book on continental philosophy of social science. The figures Sherratt discusses have a great deal to teach us about the social sciences. Her book will provide a valuable service if it provokes further discussion of this important but neglected topic. Sherratt also identifies a promising way of thinking about this topic. The notion of humanism is a helpful frame for making sense of continental philosophy of social science, and for explaining what is distinctive about it. But it also raises problems. Sherratt never convincingly shows that all the figures she discusses really are humanists. Clearly, some of them are. Gadamer, to name one, readily acknowledges his debts to the humanist tradition. But others are much less sympathetic to humanism, and Sherratt is forced to cite rather flimsy evidence to make her case. Her claim that Nietzsche and Adorno are humanists seems to rest on the fact that their books are "littered with references to the Ancients" (179). This is true enough, but Nietzsche's texts are littered with references to Kant, and Adorno's are littered with references to jazz. Referring to something does not show that one approves of it. Another problem is that Sherratt pays little attention to the considerable tensions between humanism and recent continental thought. Some of the philosophers she discusses have criticized humanism for making questionable assumptions about what human beings are and how their existence should be understood. Heidegger's Letter on Humanism is the classic statement of this criticism, and any discussion of humanism and continental philosophy should engage with it. But Sherratt does not mention this text. This suggests that she has not examined humanism from as many angles as her thesis demands.

The biggest problem with this book is that it says very little about social science. It says almost nothing about what "[s]ociologists, political scientists, human geographers, literary critics" (225), and other social scientists actually do, or about how continental thought helps make sense of their work. The one exception is a brief discussion of Clifford Geertz in Part One. Sherratt examines Geertz's study of a Balinese cockfight to show that it embodies a hermeneutical approach to anthropology, one concerned with interpreting the meanings of cultural artifacts. But Geertz's debts to hermeneutics are already well-known. It is not clear that this book tells us anything new about the practice of social science. Sherratt would no doubt reply that this objection is based on an overly narrow view of the philosophy of social science. She would argue that not all work in the field need be "concerned with empirical issues [or] conducted by those with empirical training" (3). She understands philosophy of social science more broadly, as encompassing "all the traditions engaged in the study of human society" (3). This is fair enough. But it implies that any philosopher who reflects on society is a philosopher of social science. And is any philosopher not concerned with human society, either directly or indirectly? If our definition of a term is so broad that it excludes nothing, it probably needs to be refined.

The point is that philosophy of society is not the same thing as philosophy of social science. Sherratt says a great deal about the former, but not about the latter. She might, of course, simply have called her book Continental Philosophy of Society. But then it would have looked like one more book on a familiar topic, rather than the first English-language book on a neglected one. Ultimately, what is disappointing about this book is the gap between its "internal aim" (200) and what it actually accomplishes.

[1] See, for example, Jacques Derrida, "Three Questions to Hans-Georg Gadamer," in Dialogue and Deconstruction, trans. and ed. Diane Michelfelder and Richard Palmer, Albany: SUNY Press, 1989, 52-54.

[2] Kathy Eden, Hermeneutics and the Rhetorical Tradition: Chapters in the Ancient Legacy and its Humanist Reception, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1997.

[3] For a sustained critique of this reading, see Rodolphe Gasché, The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1986. For Derrida's own rejection of scepticism, see Jacques Derrida, Limited Inc, trans. Samuel Webster, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1988, 146.

[4] Paul Ricoeur, "Structure and Hermeneutics," trans. Kathleen McLaughlin, in The Conflict of Interpretations, ed. Don Ihde, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1974, 27-61.

[5] See Gary Gutting, Michel Foucault's Archaeology of Scientific Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989, 274.