Contingency and Commitment: Mexican Existentialism and the Place of Philosophy

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Carlos Alberto Sánchez, Contingency and Commitment: Mexican Existentialism and the Place of Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2016, 161pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438459455.

Reviewed by Manuel R. Vargas, University of California, San Diego and University of San Francisco


In 1948, a group of philosophers in Mexico began a spirited and public engagement with existentialism. The movement flourished for only four years, but Carlos Alberto Sánchez argues that the project was of considerably greater philosophical importance than its brief duration might suggest. In Sánchez's reading, Mexican existentialism was, "that moment in the history of philosophy when Mexican philosophers hesitated before the Eurocentric conception of philosophy and identified [philosophy] with a quest for self-awareness" (91). The hallmark of this movement was an attempt to put the notion of Mexicanness at the center of a systematic research program in philosophy, and to explore the way in which this situated, contingent way of being might inform philosophical and practical commitments. This book is a lively and intellectually serious engagement with this sometimes incredible but oftentimes fascinating philosophical movement.

Sánchez argues that Mexican existentialism is worth our attention for at least three reasons. First, an accurate global history of existentialism, one that takes seriously the case of Mexican existentialism, looks interestingly different from the conventional story. Second, there are lessons to be learned from the Mexican appropriation of European existentialism, and these insights can inform our understanding of the situation(s) of Latinxs and the proper aspirations of a Latinx philosophy.[1] In particular, Mexican existentialism provides a template for a kind of liberationist project that remains worth pursuing. Third, the project of Mexican existentialism reflects both an important and underappreciated way of doing philosophy, one that starts from reflections on the particular, concrete, situated, and contingent circumstances of its production. Sánchez offers an intricate and wide-ranging case for each of these claims. He also goes on to explore the nature of interpretation, and the specific purposes for which we might undertake readings of historical philosophy. This slender volume covers a lot of ground.

Most of the chapters can function as stand-alone essays, with the odd numbered chapters focusing on larger themes and the even numbered chapters focusing on individual figures. The book works reasonably well as an introduction to the movement and its figures. That said, it is less an introduction than a scholarly meditation on the value of philosophy pursued in the manner of Mexican existentialism. It surely helps to come to the book with some familiarity with the figures that loom large in this narrative, e.g., José Gaos, Luis Villoro, Leopoldo Zea, Emilio Uranga, and Jorge Portilla.

One might fear that this makes the matter of audience tricky. Most of the works that are the subject of the volume are unavailable in English, and too many contemporary philosophical readers are handicapped by insufficient competence with Spanish to readily read the original texts, even if one's library carried them.[2] Presumably, that's part of the point: among other things, Sánchez endeavors to show why we should read and teach these figures, why we should endeavor to see them translated, and why the way they did philosophy can profitably inform how we go about doing philosophy today.

* * *

The introductory chapter offers some reflections about the nature and limits of interpretation. Sánchez declares his interest in appropriation, rather than (a maybe impossible, he thinks) strict fidelity to texts. His approach to appropriation is governed by (1) the interest in reading for the purposes of learning about the problems of the time in which the texts are written, but also (2) the utility of these texts in aiding our understanding of our own time, or responding to our present philosophical interests (5). This sort of reading does violence to the text, he thinks, and we do well to recognize that this departure from an author's aspirations and concerns is both intentional and defensible.

Chapter 1 turns its attention to the inaugural event of Mexican existentialism, a series of lectures on French existentialism given in 1948 by a group of prominent Mexican philosophers (the Hyperion group) at the French Institute of Latin America in Mexico City. The resulting texts, most notably those by Uranga, Villoro, Zea, and Portilla, were published in 1948-9 in the journal Filosofía y letras. Those texts range from mere exposition of European existentialist texts to more creative appropriations, in Sánchez's sense, of those texts. Sánchez extracts a set of overlapping if sometimes very distinct projects in those works. Among the key ideas are the importance of recognizing that philosophy is always produced from a particular set of circumstances; that one needs to take responsibility for one's future; that this involves a responsibility to others; that one can (and perhaps should) read philosophical works motivated by a concern for how they help us respond to a set of concrete circumstances; and that liberation it to be found by philosophical reflection on the contingency of one's circumstances.

One of the particularly interesting discussions in the first chapter concerns Portilla's "pause" in an otherwise unremarkable reading of Sartre, a pause in which Portilla registers a disagreement with Sartre's atheism. Sánchez explores the biographical context of that pause, and the resultant trajectory of Portilla's work. The discussion of Portilla continues in Chapter 2, where Sánchez revisits and revises his prior interpretation of Portilla's major work Fenomenología del relajo.[3]

In chapter 3, Sánchez explores various ways key notions of the existentialist project were developed, and ultimately abandoned by many of the members of the Hyperion group. The discussion is framed by (and a comment on) a set of concepts found in the work of Uranga. These include the idea of nepantla -- a kind of "in-betweenness" that Uranga regarded as fundamental to Mexican circumstances -- and the idea of zozobra, which Sánchez characterizes as "a state of incessant swinging to-and-fro between possibilities of existence" (66-7) that arises from the experience of the contingency of nepantla.[4] The idea is that the Mexican circumstance, situated between indigeneity and Europeanness, creates an experience of the world that captures something fundamental to human existence. What is captured or expressed in that experience is the fact of radical contingency, the recognition of which tends to induce a kind of anxiety on those aware of it. Outside of Mexican circumstances, this aspect of being tends to be more readily obscured by cultural and ideological forces that hide the nature of being.

Apart from Zea's ongoing enthusiasm for circumstance and context as the foundation for philosophical work, it did not take much for the rest of the Hyperion group to come to reject the central tenants of this approach, dismissing in different ways a vision of philosophy that makes commitment and circumstances the central notions. In particular, Villoro and Ricardo Guerra, respectively, came to think that philosophy that foregrounded or focused on circumstances was too barren, narrow or circumscribed. For Villoro and Guerra, circa 1958, the only project worthy of being identified as philosophy had to emphasize a manner of living, a kind of detachment from worldly interests and demands (82-3). Proper philosophy was a form of life that produced detached or "objective" accounts of everyday life. For them, philosophy was simultaneously three things that some of us tend to think of as distinct enterprises: (a) the art of living, (b) the disinterested pursuit of truth, and (c) the articulation of ordinary experience.

The fractious debates over what was "true" "real" or "authentic" philosophy that arose in the aftermath of the existentialist moment in Mexico spawned a long (and ongoing) dispute within Latin American philosophy. Sánchez concludes Chapter 3 by weaving in some of those ongoing threads. He discusses the "double bind" faced by philosophy outside the Western European and U.S. ambit (namely, that either it is derivative or not really philosophy) and various objections drawn from later philosophers (e.g., Abelardo Villegas, Carlos Pereda, and Guillermo Hurtado). He rejects the accusation that the Mexican existentialists were victims of philosophical immaturity, narrowness of concern, and "sub-altern fervor," i.e., a disposition to ape whatever was then influential elsewhere. Echoing an interpretive stance taken by Zea, Sánchez argues that this is a misreading -- that their projects were often appropriations that recast existentialism for original and innovative purposes, and that the emphasis on the circumstantial was a point of departure for more "universalizing" ambitions (88).

In Chapter 4, the focus returns to an individual figure, Uranga. Sánchez proposes an interesting -- and plausible -- reading of Uranga knowingly endeavoring to combine Heideggerian insights with the work of John Dewey. The upshot is the possibility of a shared "circumstance" between Mexico and the Americas, including the U.S. In turn, this points to the possibility of a more broadly American (in the sense of both Americas) existentialism.

Chapter 5 takes up one version of this possibility. In particular, it argues that one value of Mexican existentialism is that it serves as a model for Latinx liberation, as well as a Latinx philosophy.

* * *

The rise and fall of Mexican existentialism constituted one moment in a much wider and still ongoing debate in Latin America and elsewhere between, on the one hand, situated, contingent philosophy, and on the other, decontextualized "universalist" philosophy. Sánchez comes down firmly on the side of situated philosophy. He also explicitly repudiates the direction of most Mexican philosophy after the existentialist moment of the late 40s and early 1950s. He writes that, "Encouraged by smart men to aspire to great heights and think of possibilities and not actualities . . . Mexican philosophers have found it necessary to deny their own history and their own circumstance" (92). Sánchez finds fault in this, and thinks that it is wasted effort to strive to do non-situated philosophy, noting that, "we cannot go far enough or deep enough to fulfill the condescending aspirations of the Western ideal of philosophy" (92).

If I have understood him, his "we" is meant to include three potentially distinct groups, including: the "we who are Mexican and doing philosophy"; the "we who are of Mexican descent and doing philosophy"; and perhaps even "the we who participate in or draw from the history of Mexican philosophy." If he means all that -- that the members of these groups are excluded from satisfying the aspirations of the Western ideal of philosophy -- then the claim is surely too strong. Actuality is disproof of impossibility. There are a number of philosophers who are plausibly in the categories Sánchez has in mind, but who have professionally succeeded at "universalist" versions of late 20th century and early 21st century Anglophone philosophy. It cannot be true that members of these groups are always excluded from success at non-situated or "universalist" philosophy.

It is also unclear to me that those inclined to pursue non-situated philosophy are thereby denying their own history and circumstance. Tending one part of the philosophical garden need not be a repudiation of the blooms in another part. To be sure, some philosophers pursuing non-situated philosophy have indeed sought to deny their circumstances as Sánchez notes. Nevertheless, the mere fact that one is not focusing one's philosophy on one's historically situated circumstances, or not taking the local as one's explicitly enunciated point of departure, does not necessarily mean that one is denying one's circumstances. For all Sánchez has shown, it remains an open question what different starting points and methodological presumptions get us. Even among those who agree that liberation is a central task for philosophy, it is difficult to make out what the basis is supposed to be for thinking that (we can know in advance that) non-circumstantialist philosophy cannot contribute to various kinds of liberation.

That said, Sánchez is surely right that there is a kind of risk here for philosophers whose social position (because of language, geographic location, pedigree, access to intellectual networks, the effects of bias, and so on) puts them at a disadvantage with respect to the status- and resource-rich parts of the global philosophical profession. It is naïve to think that brilliant work produced in Spanish in Mexico City stands an equal opportunity to be recognized on the global stage as the same idea produced in English in New York or in French in Paris. What may be propelling Sánchez's thought here is that decontextualized philosophy is a luxury available only to those suitably positioned in the global network of ideas and prestige. Everyone else is likely to achieve more -- liberation, insight, and success -- by rejecting those norms and focusing on what is of more immediate value to one's particular circumstances. Perhaps Sánchez's recommendation that Latinxs look away from decontextualized philosophy can be recast as less a matter of a categorical normative conception of philosophy than a sober-minded assessment of a promising intellectual niche.

I suspect that many metaphilosophical predilections come to something like this, i.e., local assessments of a promising intellectual niche, given one's temperament, pedigree, cultural capital, and social position. Distinct (meta)philosophical projects might be done in better and worse ways, each according to its aspirations. However, the choice of which philosophical project appeals to us might be less a product of impartial reason than a function of what is afforded to us by position and local circumstance. For some of us, the situatedness of our philosophical predilections might be something strategically ignored or passed over in silence. That's one way social advantage is supposed to work, after all. A full and honest story about philosophy's history and its tacit regionalism would not be so blinkered, however. It is to Sánchez's credit that he has done some of the painstaking work to show why circumstances can and do matter for how we conceive of what philosophy is, and what it might yet be (again).

[1] Following a recent convention, I use the term 'Latinx' as a gender neutral rendering of what is sometimes picked out by 'Latino' and 'Latino/Latina' and 'Latina/o' and 'Latin@'. Alas, there is no fraught-free term here.

[2] This is something that Carlos Sánchez and Robert Sánchez are working to solve with a forthcoming anthology of translations of 20th century Mexican philosophy.

[3] Sánchez, Carlos Alberto. 2012. The Suspension of Seriousness: On the Phenomenology of Jorge Portilla. State University of New York Press.

[4] A minor quibble about an interpretive matter: the literal etymological root of the term zozobra is most plausibly rendered in English as "overturning." And, a common context of its use in Spanish picks out the idea of capsizing. However, the operative sense here is something Sánchez rightly emphasizes, namely, a kind of emotional state: anxiety, disturbance, even anguish. Still, I wonder if the idea of overturning or capsizing indicates something about what Uranga had in mind. Here's a proposal: Uranga's point was that the experience of Mexicanness as neither and both fully European and indigenous produces an experience of disrupted calm (the anxiety of the threat -- i.e., the fear of capsizing or being overturned). If that's right, zozobra isn't itself the too-and-fro, or the oscillation, as Sánchez has it. Instead, it is the result of the too-and-fro, i.e., the instability that arises from being pulled in different and competing directions. On the reading I'm proposing, Uranga's "logic of oscillation" is a characterization of one's the experience of nepantla, and it is this oscillation tends to produce a further thing, the anxiety or anguish of the threat of being overturned -- i.e., zozobra. I think Sánchez can take this interpretation on board, sin peligro de zozobrar.