Contingent Pacifism: Revisiting Just War Theory

Placeholder book cover

Larry May, Contingent Pacifism: Revisiting Just War Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 272pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107121867.

Reviewed by Jan Narveson, University of Waterloo


In this new book, Larry May develops and defends what he claims is a special and new outlook on war: "contingent" pacifism. Pacifists hold that all war is unjustified. Contingent pacifists do not; they agree that it is at least possible for war to be justified. But they also think that very few wars are just and, in particular, that probably no current war or war in the recent past was, nor will any foreseeable future wars be, just. In these latter claims, they seem to disagree with what I shall lamely call "most people." To us it seems obvious that our participation in some wars is justified, presumably a good many more than contingent pacifists think. But this appears, at least, to be a disagreement only on the subject of how many wars are or are not justified, and not obviously on questions of principle.

The thirteen chapters are in four sections, "Varieties of Pacifism," "Human Rights and the Just War," "International Law and the Practice of Peace," and "Conscience and Conscientious Refusal," followed by a short chapter "Final thoughts and conclusions." Like me, many readers, will probably find the general idea immensely puzzling. The ensuing discussion is largely devoted to resolving that puzzlement.

Contingent pacifists claim to disagree with Just War theory. How so? At its most general, after all, Just War theory says that it is possible for a war to be just, and Contingent Pacifism, by definition, agrees with that. So how could there be a difference as far as the barest understanding of these terms is concerned? Presumably it's not just a matter of degree. If there is a real difference between the two, other than of degree, one would suppose it must concern the criteria of justification. And yet, May says that the criteria for assessing the justice of wars proposed by the (modern) Just War theorist are much the same as those accepted by the contingent pacifist. But is either theorist committed to a specific set of criteria, with each having a different set? It would seem not.

Much more fundamental, I think, is a pervasive problem -- two, actually. The fundamental one is this: all of us, I would hope, are "against war." What I mean by that is that we all think that war is a bad thing; we would prefer a world in which what we call "war" doesn't happen -- that international and internal political disagreements are never resolved by force of arms. Unfortunately, to say that is pretty unhelpful in almost all versions of the world we humans have, socially speaking, occupied for several millennia.

More to the point is what, I should think, most of us mean: that in every war, somebody started it, and that that party shouldn't have. That somebody, we think, was/is an aggressor: he is trying to extract some political benefit by the use of lethal force against harmless people, and it is morally wrong to do that. So all wars are wrong in the sense that they happen only because somebody is committing wrongful, unjust actions. This, however, implies nothing in the way of pacifisms. For we also think that if A is attacked, and is innocent, then A has the right to defend himself. What is to be justified is not starting a war, but deciding to use military force to defend those who are attacked by the aggressive party. Is May disputing that? He makes many well-enough-taken points about the dangers of implementing this principle, but he doesn't seem to be fundamentally disputing it, as the out-and-out pacifist would.

Let's agree that this bifurcation is prima facie simplistic. Sometimes it is difficult to say who or what is "being aggressive." But suppose, as most of us surely think, that often it is decidable. Then let's look at it from the point of view of those targeted by the aggressors. The out-and-out pacifist apparently thinks that they have no right, no business, defending themselves by similarly lethal force. But the "contingent pacifist" position disagrees with that. Just where, then, does that leave us?

Perhaps the difference lies in this: seizing on the "last resort" clause of normal Just War theory, they insist that rarely is that response a genuinely last resort, among other things -- alternatives aren't sufficiently pursued. Or, seizing on the Proportionality clause, or other elements of Just War theory, they'll hold that those who claim they are just trying to defend themselves are overdoing it. But there is surely no disagreement about the wrongness of killing innocent people. There may be disagreement about whether it is ever justified to kill them as a byproduct of military necessity. Again, though, no one disagrees that it would be great if it never were militarily necessary. But suppose it really is necessary? Suppose that many, many lives will be lost, or enslaved, etc., if we do not make the military move that also results in innocents being killed? Tragic arithmetic, yes -- but sometimes very real.

A big question then arises: are we to press these problems to the point that we are supposed to let the bad guys win? -- on the ground that the innocent may never be sacrificed? May isn't entirely confident about the answer even in the case of World War II. So let's focus on it. Is he saying that the Poles in 1939 ought not to have fought back? Of course, they didn't have a prayer of success, most of them knew that, but they fought back anyway. Were they wrong? And what about the British and French who eventually did respond with armed force -- were they supposed to just let Hitler conquer them? The French eventually did, and the British didn't; when the Americans at last came to their aid, everything changed, as we know. Were they not supposed to do that? Did they, indeed, have no right to do that? Persuading us of affirmative answers to those questions, most of us think, would be a very tough proposition.

But now we have the enormous problem posed by much current military activity. Today's wars are mostly not standard, old-fashioned ones. (Such wars may be extinct.) Rather, they are insurgencies, civil wars. Often enough the insurgents wear no uniforms and engage in their evil actions for vague purposes. And so on. Life has become more complicated. So a different rubric is used: contemporary military efforts by the U.S. and its NATO allies are called "humanitarian." The idea is not so much that a nation (ours, say) is about to be invaded by a large army, but that evil people are murdering and tyrannizing many innocent people, and we want to try to stop that. When we do, we often get into deep trouble, as we know from experience. Does that mean we shouldn't try?

There are also some more familiar actions by state armies that add further material for reflection. Here the allegedly aggressor state does have the old-fashioned motives of solidifying or expanding empires. Russian actions in Ukraine and the Chinese claims on most of the South Chinese Sea come to mind. Again, they raise the question: does May mean to argue that no state military may be used to counter such aggressions? And again: agreed, other strategies may work -- economic punishments of the sort being used against Russia, for instance. But if they don't work? Then what? It is not obvious that any use of military force for such purposes is unjustifiable, and it is extremely unobvious what other means are available. Does May think it is? Whatever he may personally think, it is hard to see that his advocated principles really rule it out.

In a characteristic statement, May writes,

It is my view that the risks of killing those who have a right not to be killed is so great during war or armed conflict that soldiers and other combatants should not take the risk of fighting and instead should refuse to fight. They should urge their leaders to seek more peaceful ways to solve the world's problems (68).

One is inclined to respond: Sure! But some of the world's militaristic leaders apparently don't follow this advice. They applaud the non-fighter on the side of their enemies and would be happy if we were all like that -- it would make their conquests so much easier! As a "solution" to the War problem, this surely counts as a nonstarter.

As a possible resolution individuals might make it's of course to be respected. But should they think that way? This brings up May's discussions of conscience and conscientious refusal. He takes the net impact of his arguments to be that we should, generally speaking, refuse to engage in military service.

Many of those who volunteer to serve in modern armies obviously don't see it May's way. They reason that if push comes to shove and their country needs defending, then somebody needs to do it, and they choose to be one of the defenders. (Let's admit too that some join the military for love of adventure, or because it's a decent living and they might be good at it.) Are these people -- either sort -- doing something wrong? Here it is acutely pertinent to point out that, on the face of it, it's the other side that's doing something wrong, and wrong by the very standard May wants to invoke: respect for human rights. They are all ready to invade and despoil and kill for the sake of their political goals, which too often are a compound of political and religious ideological goals. Our question is: what are we going to do about it? Trying to get them to the conference table is fine, but what if they won't go, or if they get there, prove intransigent?

A major concern for May is the rights of soldiers, not just of innocent bystanders. But as he says, rights can sometimes justifiably be overridden. And clearly someone who has volunteered to fight in a military unit puts his life on the line. My right to life is also a right to decide to risk that life for some purpose. It might be climbing mountains, or it might be helping one's country to ward off an armed threat. The soldiers on the other side have similarly used their rights to life in a risky way. It seems quite plausible to say that soldiers need have no compunctions about killing enemy soldiers so long as those soldiers are trying to kill us. And this can be so even though many of them are arguably quite "innocent." Hitler's soldiers likely hadn't seriously harmed a soul prior to enlisting; many jihadi warriors are pressed into service; and so on.

May is not, presumably, advocating general suicide for people on "our" side. But if he's not, it's hard to see what alternative he can have. Here, to be sure, contingent pacifists will want to come down pretty heavily on the distinction between individual-on-individual cases and the collective activities that wars ordinarily so called involve. But it's not clear quite how much we can draw from that. A man in a tower at the University of Texas, years ago, opened fire on students in the quad below. Trained police eventually killed him with carefully aimed sniper rifles. How many lives they saved is not clear, but it's easy to believe it could have been many, and if it was, then would the contingent pacifist want to deny that killing the shooter was justified? As to negotiating, the longer the marksmen wait before shooting, the more innocent people are murdered. So, presumably not. Or, an American officer who turned out to be a secret jihadist opens fire at a meeting of his fellow officers in Texas, killing 15 before being overpowered. If someone in the hall had been armed and shot him, would the contingent pacifist object? I think not -- even though that jihadist thought of himself as engaged in a war with the American army.

To make much of the distinction, then, the contingent pacifist must confine his thesis to wars in the more or less standard sense -- sizable armies directed at seizing objectives or defending those objectives. About these, presumably the contingent pacifist wants to point especially to: first, the near-certainty of killing innocents, and second, the non-"lastness" of the resort to force and the availability of workable alternatives. (A third, that soldiers are conscripts, has not applied for many years in NATO countries and raises independent issues. People being hauled off to the front and turned into "cannon fodder" grates very strongly on the contemporary soul. It is fascinating that it seems not to have done so in the two World Wars. But the voluntariness of those bearing the maximum risk is, to my and most minds, a crucial factor -- especially when the war's goals are humanitarian rather than narrowly national-defensive.)

The "wars" that worry us now are aimed at things like ethnic cleansing, religious purification, and of course the seizing of political power for the purpose of advancing such programs (and also, so often, for the advancement of the power and incomes of the leaders.) If we say that people ought not to use lethal force for such purposes, we say what is true. But many are doing that, and so the question is, what do we do? Beyond doubt innocents will be killed however careful we are. But the bad guys will kill a great many more if allowed to have their way. If we say that we must not kill innocents under any circumstances, we would indeed be pacifists, and doing so even in cases where the extreme evil of the objectionable force is manifest and clear. War is terrible, and the decisions it forces upon us are often agonizing. But May's proposals about those decisions seem to many of us just too pat -- indeed, unreal.

If these considerations seem pretty overwhelming, many readers will probably not be too interested in the array of fine distinctions May develops. Well exemplifying my point is the section, "Human Rights and the Just War." In a war, commanders and leaders tend to count costs -- literally. A main cost is the soldiers, the "boots on the ground" who carry the primary responsibility and take the main risks of war-fighting; but another cost, certainly, is the "collateral damage," the civilians, including children, who get caught in the crossfire. While it is obvious to the liberal mind that those are indeed costs and must be taken seriously, it is not obvious that in war-fighting, the rights of the fighters are violated, and while it is sometimes obvious that the rights of the innocent are, the big problem is what one is to do about that problem, other than, of course, do our best to minimize such costs.

The trouble is that if we put an extremely high value on those costs, that will encourage the unscrupulous enemy to do what they mostly nowadays do -- make very sure that lots of innocent lives are put at risk so as to discourage their liberal enemies from attacking. As I noted earlier, May says, "It is my view that the risks of killing those who have a right not to be killed is so great during war or armed conflict that soldiers and other combatants should not take the risk of fighting and instead should refuse to fight." (68). Now, suppose that the enemy knows that their enemy -- us -- thinks that way. If "we" all did, one supposes, it would evidently be impossible to fight the war at all, and that would be just fine with our enemies. Is May depending on speculation that no possible state or would-be state is so inhuman as to think that way? And to act on it by doing even more of what we are well aware they are quite ready to do in present circumstances? That many do think that way must be evident from the number and intensity of history's wars. Christ certainly didn't have much luck promoting May's attitude, and of course numerous of his supposed followers have participated in wars replete with savagery.

Certainly we have a practical problem living in the world as it is, where many are more than ready to take up arms, not only in behalf of worthy causes but more especially on behalf of savagery, barbarism, cruelty, and tyranny of the most awful kinds. People like that aren't generally moved much by thoughts of "violating human rights," and if we are, we had better think carefully about our options. That, I take it, is the main incentive behind Just War theorizing. Given a world in which some are ready to be totally unconcerned about the "justice" of what they are doing, what do we who hope to be promoting justice do by way of reaction? That we will try to minimize human rights violations while nevertheless defending legitimate interests seems the best we can do.

Now, as noted, most modern Western armies are no longer filled with conscripts. (Even among those few that are, such as Israel, the rights of conscientious objectors are scrupulously respected.) By and large our armies are volunteers. They may join for misguided reasons, but those are their reasons. We do not coerce modern soldiers. We pay them well, and by and large feed and house them as well as possible. It is perfectly true that "the burden of justifying war is always on the side of those who defend war." But it is equally true that that burden is prima facie well met by the observation that we are literally defending innocent people who otherwise are put at severe risk. (Of course, some wars do not meet that rigorous requirement and are very open to objection. But there need be no difference in principle between May and the rest of us about such things.)

This makes it difficult, I think, to agree with May's claim that contingent pacifism differs from Just War theory "in that the likely loss of lives of all those affected by a military action in the conduct of war needs to be put into the balance and weighed against the military objectives aimed at." (75) No reasonable leader in the West would dispute a single word of that sentence. Among humane and reasonable people, all military activity is strictly subordinate to the political ends being pursued, and those ends must be in terms of human lives and liberties being defended and promoted -- not only ours but also those of the citizens of other states, or other civilians involved or significantly affected by the war in question.

Apropos of this general issue, we should consider the question whether fighters on side X should rate the lives of their own soldiers and civilians as being more worthy of efforts to economize than of those on the other side. In the First Gulf war, the total loss of life on the Allied side was less than 300, as against around 9-10,000 of Saddam Hussein's soldiers. Is there anything inherently objectionable about that (as opposed to objectionable to the Iraqi soldiers)? May notes that people cannot lead a "characteristically human life" if they are deprived of the one life they have. To the soldier, this is a no-brainer. Soldiers fight for their buddies, not against the enemy. (Given the closeness and extreme urgency of life on the battlefield, soldiers' concern for each other is maximal. You'll rarely find a soldier who was not ready to sacrifice his own life in order to save that of one or more of his close buddies in combat.) It is natural to defend ourselves and our own first, while others are well down the list. Is it just? In the obvious sense of "is this permissible?," the answer is surely affirmative. Would a more "ideal" justice require a thorough reform to our souls -- indeed, can it? On ordinary views of justice -- with which I largely side -- No. Justice is for us as we are.

War, as May says, "causes extremely serious risks to all humans . . . in ways that are not significantly different for humans on one side . . . than on the other". And he adds, "This is not to say that the risked loss of liberty is not important, but only that in most cases it is not as important as the risked loss of life itself." (79) Against this I would want -- again, I think, along with almost everybody -- to say two things. First, imposed losses of liberty are fully as important as loss of life, and really, basically far more important -- which is why it is worth taking up arms to defend our liberties even at risk of our lives. And secondly, justice is not mainly a matter of the "worth" of various things but rather of respecting persons. People whose lives might be thought to have very little "worth" nevertheless have rights. They have, in particular, the right to defend themselves against others who place a low value on their rights, and that includes defending their liberties against supposedly superior "Supermen." It is this general point that makes the pacifistic argument, to most of us, so basically wrong-headed.

May also insists, more plausibly, that we should not view individuals, including those on the other side, as mere representatives of their State. "The case where the voter needs to be killed in order to save our own citizens from attack" is "rare and out of the realm of reality". That's misleading since it is indeed extremely rare that voters just happen to be in the voting booth at the wrong time, but frequent that people able to vote happen to be in those places. It is not at all rare, however, that citizens elect leaders who do mount attacks. (Hitler is a classic example.)

May raises some good questions about collective responsibility. He is clearly right that individual soldiers on either side are rarely the instigators of war and they are rarely well informed about the justification of a particular war. It is the case that soldiers in wartime are aware that they put themselves at risk, possibly severe risk, and that what they do is correctly perceived as dangerous to their enemy, making it likely, if it wasn't already, that they will try to defend themselves by making life as dangerous as possible for the soldiers in question. May's kinds of questions, operationally speaking, can by and large only be addressed practically by the political leaders of the countries in question. And if they do not address them, we can expect war to be awful -- as it is. None of which, nevertheless, impugns the soldier's right to defend himself and his buddies, and more generally his people.

I have omitted detailed discussion of many of May's arguments, which are interesting and to be taken seriously. But I'd close with a word on his final statement: "we should all counsel young men and women to be reluctant to follow their leaders into war, no matter how enduringly appealing it may seem." (258) The military profession offers extreme danger to potential enemies, and much risk to its practitioners, and obviously those need to be taken seriously. But 'no matter how' is very strong indeed, and I am reluctant to share in his recommended reluctance all the way to that level. Some wars, alas, deserve our support.