Continuants: Their Activity, Their Being, and Their Identity

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David Wiggins, Continuants: Their Activity, Their Being, and Their Identity, Oxford University Press, 2016, 239pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716624.

Reviewed by Harold Noonan, University of Nottingham


This book of twelve essays is a selection of David Wiggins's writings from the last four and a half decades on the topics of substance and identity. The earliest is from 1968 and the last from 2016. They are deliberately not substantially rewritten so that readers can appreciate Wiggins's progress. However, as Wiggins puts it, he has pursued a policy of local repair and improvement, to do justice to the Aristotelian insight from which he once began. The book also contains a very useful bibliography of Wiggins's writings between 1964 and 2016.

The revision and additions take different forms for the different essays: straightforward revision, additional critical commentary, new material, abbreviation and reorganization. But in every case Wiggins's aim is to keep us up to date with his latest thinking on the topics in question.

There is a substantial introduction, parts of which are, Wiggins tells us, 'perfectly essential' to the understanding of all the essays in the book and gives a convenient summary of his main intentions. Chapter 1 is an essay published in 2012, 'Identity, Individuation and Substance', which is intended as a continuation of Sameness and Substance Renewed, the third book in the series beginning with, or the second revision of, Identity and Spatio-Temporal Continuity.The second chapter is Wiggins's 1968 essay 'On Being in the Same Place at the Same Time', with an added critical commentary. The third chapter is Wiggins's 1995 survey article, 'Substance', reprinted from the volume edited by A.C. Grayling, Philosophy: A Guide Through the Subject. The fourth chapter is the 1987 essay, 'The Person as Object of Science, as Subject of Experience, and as Locus of Value'. 'Sameness, Substance and the Human Animal', from 2000, is the fifth chapter.

Chapters 6 and 7, both unrevised, are concerned respectively with the thoughts of Heraclitus and Leibniz. Chapter 8, 'Putnam's Doctrine of Natural Kind Words and Frege's Doctrine of Sense, Reference and Extension: Can They Cohere?', from 1993, is Wiggins's attempt to get a grip on Hilary Putnam's views on meaning, reference and natural kinds. Chapter 9, 'The De Re Must' similarly makes contact with Saul Kripke's views and attempts to assess the argument for the necessity of identity, responding particularly to the critical reactions of A. J. Ayer and W.V.O. Quine. Chapter Ten, 'Mereological Essentialism', from 1979, is an assessment of Roderick Chisholm's development of this position.

The general thesis and main doctrines of these papers are set out in the introduction.

Beginning with Identity and Spatio-Temporal Continuity, sortalism, the doctrine that the question 'same what?' (the answer to which will be given using a sortal term which can also be given in answer to a question of the form 'what is x?', asked in a special Aristotelian sense) has to be asked when it is said that x and y are the same, has been a constant in Wiggins's thought. Early on he distinguished it from the relative identity thesis -- that x and y can be the same F and different Gs -- which provides, he thinks, an incorrect explanation of the demand. But then whence the necessity? An obvious thought is that once one has identified x and identified y, one has done all that is needed to make sense of the question whether x is y. Answering the question 'same what?' may be a step in providing these identifications, but it is not an additional step. So it is not the identity in question which needs specification but the referents of the singular terms. This is, I think, a central concern about the sortalist doctrine which Wiggins struggles with throughout his writing. Reflection on the logic of identity is supposed to lead us to sortalism, but the route is an obscure one.

Connected to Wiggins's sortalism is the emphasis he places, of course, on the Aristotelian notion of substance, and this in turn involves the notion of a principle of activity or behaviour common to the kind of substance in question. This is how he connects questions of identity with questions of persistence through time. Again, these links are problematic and difficult to be confident about. An opposing viewpoint, of which Wiggins is always aware, is the Quinean one, which gives no special role to sortal concepts in considering identity questions, has no place for the notion of substance and regards persistence though time as no more a matter identity than variation over space. Of course, the title of the collection, 'Continuants: Their Activity, Their Being, and Their Identity', precisely identifies Wiggins's non-Quinean focus.

Another thesis which is important to Wiggins, and which he emphasises in the introduction is his 'conceptual realism'. He sums this up as the thesis that 'what sortal concepts we can bring to bear upon experience determines what we can find there -- just as the size and mesh of a net determine, not what fish are in the sea, but which ones we shall catch'.Surely this is true. But I was unclear from Wiggins's exposition why it could be any more than a platitude once the metaphor is replaced with a literal statement.

Finally in the introduction, Wiggins addresses one of the worries about the sortalist account of identity -- that it implies that one cannot refer to a thing unless one knows what it is. One can ask 'Is it a bird, is it a plane, is it Superman?' (p. 207) though different sortals will apply depending on the answer. One is fumbling, but even in fumbling one must bring to mind, Wiggins, thinks, the general idea of object of kind f, the determinable object of some kind to be determined, any determination of which will be a sortal concept.

In what remains I shall focus on Chapters 2, 4 and 5. The first of these is Wiggins's earliest paper in this selection, together with a critical commentary. It is important for providing one of the most convincing examples of the contention that two things of different kinds can be in the same place at the same time. This is now the so-called 'standard view'. It is a testimony to the significance of Wiggins's paper that arguments about this are still waging, and different interpretations of the examples of the type Wiggins described still discussed. Wiggins emphasises that his interest is in showing that a substance and an aggregate can cohabit. He does not wish to claim that two substances of different kinds can cohabit. The question this prompts, of course, is whether an aggregate is a thing, even if not a substance, at all and not a mere plurality, in which case we do not have an illustration of Wiggins's contention.

This paper is also the first to introduce Peter Geach's Tibbles and its 'tail complement' Tib to the literature. Wiggins is stoutly against the claim that Tib is ever a cat, which was Geach's claim in favour of his relative identity thesis. Again, this debate has continued with David Lewis's contribution perhaps being the most significant. Wiggins refers to this, but his comments are brief. He does not consider whether Tib is not all too catlike not to be a cat, as Lewis puts it.

In the other chapters, and also in the wide-ranging first chapter, Wiggins discusses the topic of personal identity. One of the main questions he addresses is what to say about Sydney Shoemaker's Brown/Brownson case. The standard psychological continuity account of personal identity goes with the claim that Brownson is Brown (because the same person), though not the same human animal. The standard animalist position goes with the claim that Brownson is not Brown (because not the same animal) and person is merely a phase sortal. Wiggins is not willing to take sides in this debate. In a piece of writing not in this collection he writes:

If I must allow survival, I am not sure why I am committed to denying that the survivor that emerges from all these goings on is the same human being or the same animal as the one who enters them. It is my strong impression that, while I have always refrained from saying or writing that 'person' is itself a natural kind word, I have insisted on the dependence of the concept of a person upon the concept of a human being. But once you understand what a human being is and what the seat of consciousness is, surely you will not too readily assume that you will know what it is for the human being to be given a new seat of consciousness. If transplantation really were possible, then would not the person follow the seat of consciousness? In that case does not the animal that is the survivor follow it too? ('Replies' in S. Lovibond and S.G. Willliams (eds) Essays for David Wiggins: Identity, Truth and Value, p. 246)

This suggests a sort of disjunctive account between the standard neo-Lockean and animalist positions: human beings can persist through psychological continuity and also, in its absence, through mere biological continuity; in this sense we are animals the persistence conditions of which are partly biological and partly psychological.

But Wiggins is not content with something so simple. He ends Chapter 5 with the words 'what if the remnant (brain) is housed in another body, what then? Even then the most that we can find is not a person but a sad remnant (or remnants) of a human being.' He adds in a footnote, 'such a remnant of a thing does not count as the thing, itself. Matters have gone too far.'

So Wiggins has moved on between 1996 and 2014. But as in the rest of his discussion, it is not exactly clear where he has got to. What is clear is that he is not content with any position which allows straightforward classification. After four and a half decades of thought he is still searching for satisfactory answers to the questions that obsess him, and though there is no denying the difficulties his writings sometimes present the reader, we should join him in his search and be grateful that he is still continuing, after more than forty years, to contribute to discussion of these topics on which his past writings have been so influential.