Continuity and Innovation in Medieval and Modern Philosophy: Knowledge, Mind, and Language

Placeholder book cover

John Marenbon (ed.), Continuity and Innovation in Medieval and Modern Philosophy: Knowledge, Mind, and Language, Oxford University Press, 2013, 133pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197265499.

Reviewed by Henrik Lagerlund, University of Western Ontario


The period from the later 14th century through the 15th and 16th centuries is perhaps the least known in the history of Western philosophy. Fortunately, more and more attention is given to the history of this period and to many of the most important thinkers of the time. An example of this, although less successful, is this new book edited by John Marenbon. It promises to address the issue of continuity and create a dialogue between medieval and modern philosophy, but falls short in several respects. The book is based on a meeting organized by Marenbon on behalf of the British Academy in 2011. These kinds of meetings have been held on topics in the history of philosophy since 1955, but this was the first ever on medieval philosophy, which is remarkable in itself. Marenbon decided, however, to put a twist on this meeting and asked three scholars of medieval philosophy to present papers that would be commented on by three scholars of modern philosophy. The three medievalists were Dominik Perler (Humbolt, Berlin), Martin Lenz (Groningen), and Robert Pasnau (Boulder, Colorado), and the three commentators were Andrew Pyle (Bristol), Michael Ayers (Oxford), and John Hawthorne (Oxford).

None of the essays manage to shed light very well on the period mentioned above, and they are also unable to create much of a dialogue bridging the gap between medieval and modern philosophy. The first essay by Perler and the comment by Pyle work best, while the other two, although interesting, work less well in generating the kind of dialogue Marenbon seems to have been looking for.

Perler's "What are Faculties of the Soul? Descartes and his Scholastic Background" is a very good essay, certainly the best in the collection. It looks at the background to Descartes's view on the faculties of the soul, or rather his very dismissive view of faculties, since he does not think there are any except in so far as the mind has a faculty of intellect and will, which are only nominally distinct. The most obvious predecessor in the Middle Ages is William Ockham, but this is hardly interesting or new. The more interesting aspect of Perler's essay is instead his analysis of Francisco Suárez's view of faculties.

Suárez defended a view where there are many really distinct faculties. In fact, each faculty is identified with its causal power, which in turn are really distinct from the soul. He also describes the relationship of the soul to its faculties as a master-slave relationship, and he adds that they only form a whole by aggregation. Naturally, there are many things Descartes objects to in this view. Suárez does see the faculties as little active entities in the way Descartes ridicules scholastic philosophy for doing. Perler nicely outlines the arguments and makes the reader understand why Descartes took the position he did. The commentary by Pyle also deepens the understanding of the positions held by Descartes and Suárez. The two essays work well together and generate a very nice dialogue.

The second essay.Lenz's "Locke as a Social Externalist," is a redevelopment of themes from his, Lockes Sprachkonzeption, published in 2010. Lenz is one among a small group of scholars who, in the light of new scholarship on Locke's sources and an increased awareness of a certain very influential medieval tradition, recently have started to reinterpret Locke's philosophy of language. For most people Locke is known for holding a naive kind of internalism about meaning, which in courses on philosophy of language is quickly dismissed as obviously false. Lenz instead wants to recast Locke as a kind of externalist, but not a straightforward externalist like Ockham or Putnam, but a social externalist for which the meaning of a term is determined by the social context of the speaker.

Ayers' comments are not uninteresting, but they are totally unsympathetic and wholly dismissive of Lenz's interpretation. Hence there is not much of a dialogue. The main objection Ayers has is that the central point of the interpretation that meaning is corrected for externally cannot be found in Locke. Obviously, it boils down to how one reads some of the central text passages, and the reader will have to judge for herself, but certainly Lenz's view cannot be dismissed outright. The line he develops holds that even though I have acquired a term, I do not really know what it means until I have tried to use it and been corrected by other speakers of the language. It is hence, on this view, only when my individual usage and the common usage coincide that I use a term meaningfully.

The third essay is a long and unconventional contribution by Pasnau entitled "Divisions of Epistemic Labour: Some Remarks on the History of Fideism and Esotericism." By divisions of epistemic labour, Pasnau means the division between those who are in a position to know something and those who cannot or should not know that thing. An example would be myself, as a professor, knowing all my students' grades and each student who can or should know only her own. Another example would be a certain religion in which some, perhaps a priests or monks, have a certain knowledge that others, who are followers, are not supposed to have. The later Platonic Academy was clearly esoteric about certain parts of their doctrine. Pasnau takes the reader through a tour of both Arabic and Latin medieval views about various esoteric doctrines. It is a very educational and learned essay.

It is clear from Hawthorne's comments that he did not quite know what to do with Pasnau's essay. He decided to focus solely on something that Pasnau mentions, but hardly defends in any strong or very credible sense, namely Aquinas's fideism. The issue, as always in philosophy, is not straightforward, but this seems to me not a very interesting problem with relation to Aquinas.

Overall, this is a book with the ambitious aim of creating a dialogue between medieval and modern philosophy. It does not, as indicated, succeed in this aim. But the essays are interesting, and in at least one case the comments really help deepen the issue addressed by the original essay.