Contours of Dignity

Contours Of Dignity

Suzy Killmister, Contours of Dignity, Oxford University Press, 2020, 169pp., $64.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198844365.

Reviewed by Grant J. Rozeboom, Saint Mary’s College of California


The notion of dignity is one of the mainstays of modern moral thought, primarily in its Kantian episodes. You might worry this has led to distortion, casting dignity only as a durable, uniform feature of human beings—attached to our rational nature—and leaving out its fragile, variable forms. Suzy Killmister aims to provide a systematic account of dignity that corrects this distortion by better capturing the wide array of moral roles that dignity plays in our lives. Her project is both very ambitious, insofar as she intends to provide a general account of dignity, and deliberately circumscribed, insofar as she does not claim to provide an account that is “exhaustive” or “definitive” (5). Her theory is supposed to satisfy three key desiderata: (i) it captures how dignity relates to different forms of respect that people demand; (ii) it shows how dignity varies according to how people act and are presented; and (iii) it substantiates how dignity is fragile (14–15).

Killmister’s theory divides dignity into three basic kinds, each of which is subject to the same three general forms of injury, resulting in nine potential forms of dignitarian injury. Personal dignity consists in holding oneself to “dignitarian norms,” which are norms that are “ennobling” to uphold and “debasing” or “disgraceful” to violate (25ff.). Social dignity consists in being held to dignitarian norms by one’s community. Status dignity does not involve being subject to dignitarian norms; it consists simply in membership in a social category that calls for respectful treatment (33). To explain this difference between status dignity and personal and social dignity, Killmister deploys Stephen Darwall’s distinction between appraisal and recognition respect. She thinks personal dignity and social dignity concern appraisal respect, whereas status dignity concerns recognition respect.

Each of the three kinds of dignity is vulnerable to injuries of violation, frustration, and destruction. Violating someone’s dignity consists in transgressing, or leading them to transgress, the dignity-relevant norms. For personal dignity, this consists in leading someone to transgress the dignitarian norms to which they hold themselves; for social dignity, it involves leading them to transgress the dignitarian norms of their community; and for status dignity, it consists in failing to give someone the recognition respect their social membership demands. Frustrating dignity involves obstructing the satisfaction of the dignity-relevant norms. Destroying dignity consists in removing the basis for someone’s attachment to the dignity-relevant norms, making it the case that they no longer are subject to and/or protected by those norms.

Killmister seeks to put this general conception of dignity to theoretical work in explaining how the nine different forms of dignitarian injury can and should register in our moral reasoning, examining their connection to shame, recognition respect, and human rights. She thinks that the shame (or shame-like) experiences induced by the six personal and social dignitarian injuries often, but do not always, generate claims on others to not violate or frustrate our personal or social dignity. Killmister’s go-to example to illustrate why there is no general prohibition on violating or frustrating personal or social dignity is the “Entitled Misogynist,” Barry, whose personal dignity rests on “not being denied the attention and affection of any woman from whom it is sought” (78). Women who refuse Barry’s advances violate and frustrate his personal dignity. (And, if we imagine that Barry’s norms characterize his community, women who refuse him injure his social dignity in these ways, too.) Yet, it seems clear that Barry is not wronged by them, at least not generally. The moral problem lies with Barry’s dignity, not injuries to it. Killmister explains this by suggesting that someone’s personal or social dignity can impose claims on others only if the claims are justifiable to those on whom the claims are being made. Killmister allows for a wide range of reasons (or interests) to constrain the scope of justifiable dignitarian claims, and it is clear, she thinks, that they preclude the sorts of claims generated by Barry’s misogynistic dignity on women.

When it comes to injuries that destroy personal or social dignity, Killlmister thinks the duty to protect dignity is stronger and more general. This is because she thinks the forms of treatment that destroy personal or social dignity tend to be particularly gruesome and “egregious”—she mentions torture (86), repeated trauma (87), and being treated as “beneath contempt” (98). (You might wonder whether this argument against destroying dignity extends to the destruction of Barry’s personal or social dignity; I’ll return to this issue below.)

Turning to status dignity and recognition respect—which, again, go hand-in-hand on Killmister’s view—Killmister claims that protecting someone’s status dignity, and giving them the recognition respect associated with it, is morally important because it is closely tied to (among other things) their interests in self-understanding. But here, too, there are substantial qualifications on the extent of the claims that someone’s dignity can generate. Claims to protect status dignity are “invalid” if they reify oppression (114), if no “substantial harm” is at stake (114-115), and/or if the social membership underlying them is non-existent (115).

Killmister concludes by exploring how her account can substantiate the commonly asserted connection between human dignity and human rights. She casts human dignity as a kind of status dignity deriving from an individual’s membership in the social kind human, which she thinks has come, by way of global social and legal practices, to correspond to the biological species Homo sapiens. These practices establish norms of recognition respect for how members of the human, H. sapiens kind are to be treated, and some of these norms will entail human rights (144). This means that human dignity is constituted, in part, by having human rights—a reversal of the standard view on which human rights derive from having human dignity. This is one of many fronts on which Killmister opposes what she calls “inner kernel” views, which conceive of dignity as grounded in some innate feature of human nature (such as our capacity for rational agency) and as something that can ground other moral properties, such as human rights.

I appreciate the wide range of dignitarian phenomena that Killmister’s account is poised to capture, which it does, in part, by decentralizing the morally laden conception of human dignity that is the focus of inner kernel views. This enables us to make sense of the genuine, but importantly qualified, moral significance of the many forms of dignity that have more to do with how we conceive of ourselves in our particular roles and communities and less to do with universal, morally fundamental features of humanity. I worry, though, that in trying to correct for the moralized distortions of inner kernel views, Killmister’s view goes too far.

This occurs, first, in her selection of desiderata for a theory of dignity. Recall that one of the three tasks she assigns a theory of dignity is explaining how dignity is fragile. Why, and in what sense, should we accept that dignity is generally fragile, as a pre-theoretical matter? I readily admit that dignity is the kind of thing that generally can be violated. But the fact that dignity can be violated does not show it to be fragile, for it can be violated and still remain fully intact. This is true on Killmister’s view: if I am made to transgress the dignitarian norms of my personal or social dignity, or if someone disregards the respect-norms of my status dignity, I can remain subject to the norms all the same, with my dignity sustained. So what Killmister is staking out, as a pre-theoretical desideratum, is the idea that dignity is the sort of thing that, beyond being violated, can be lessened or eliminated. Why think, from the outset, that this is true of all forms of dignity? One of the reasons why the notion of dignity has loomed so large in modern moral thought is that it seems plausible that there are some forms of dignity that are not fragile, that can withstand the moral flux of human sociality. This is apparent when, for instance, we invoke someone’s dignity as a stopgap, to call attention to something of significance about them that withstands the social and moral precarities they face. It thus seems that a theory of dignity should be able to capture both the ways in which (some forms of) dignity are fragile and the ways in which (some forms of) dignity are durable, even if we come up empty in our search for the latter.

I wonder if Killmister, in distancing herself from inner kernel views, overlooks how her view could be naturally modified to allow for the durability of dignity. Consider that there may be dignity-relevant norms—call them, broadly, “norms of respect”—that we necessarily apply to ourselves. These could be norms that, to riff on an idea from Christine Korsgaard’s Kantian constructivism, we are committed to applying to ourselves simply in virtue of being creatures who are subject to norms of respect at all. This would be a kind of personal dignity in Killmister’s sense, except that it would not be possible to damage or destroy it, at least not without damaging or destroying someone’s agency as a creature subject to norms of respect. I am not claiming there are such norms. I am simply pointing to some theoretical space for a view that would (i) preserve Killmister’s conception of dignity as being subject to norms of respect, (ii) avoid positing an “inner kernel” as the ground of dignity, and (iii) still allow for some forms of dignity that are durable.

Killmister might reply that her view already makes room for sufficiently durable forms of dignity, because she allows for status dignity to be attached to stable social kinds. This may be true, for instance, of the social kind human, which she thinks, again, has been determined by global social and legal practices to cover all and only members of H. sapiens. But this appeal to social kinds raises a further problem about the justification of norms of respect. Even if Killmister is right that there are robust global practices that both deem all members of human worthy of recognition respect and include all and only members of H. sapiens, we can still ask: Are these norms justified? Or are they just an arbitrary byproduct of, e.g., the desire to enjoy superiority over non-human creatures? Killmister eschews discussing the justification or correctness of norms of respect (81–2), focusing instead on the interests of those on whom the norms purport to make claims. Remember Barry: Killmister says his misogynistic dignity deserves no protection from the women who flout it, not because his misogynistic norms are incorrect or unjustified (although she does not rule this out), but because protecting his dignity is not justifiable to the women.

But what about Barry’s friends who share his misogynistic norms of respect and whose interests are not set back by protecting his (I’m tempted to say “false”) sense of dignity, as when, e.g., they applaud one another for their romantic exploits? Surely they, too, would not wrong Barry in refusing to protect his dignity. How can we explain this? Perhaps Killmister could claim that, if a norm of respect is not justifiable to all of those on whom it purports to make claims, it places no valid claims on any of them. This would amount to a contractualist theory of dignity-relevant norms of respect, one that would be much more demanding than Killmister’s stated moral criteria for upholding claims to protect dignity.

As one illustration, recall that Killmister thinks that, even if violating or frustrating someone’s personal (or social) dignity is sometimes permissible in light of the interests of those permitted to do the violating or frustrating, it is generally impermissible to destroy their dignity. But if we adopt a contractualist account of the justification of norms of respect, as above, this undercuts Killlmister’s claim that destroying personal (or social) dignity is generally impermissible. However much Barry’s sense of self would be shattered by destroying his misogynistic dignity, for example, it rests on unjustified norms—norms of respect that make no legitimate claims on anyone, including himself. It is not generally wrong to facilitate someone’s separation from such norms. (Of course, there will be moral constraints on our means for doing so.)

Back to human dignity. A contractualist view of what justifies norms of respect would ask: Are norms of recognition respect that cover all and only humans-qua-H. sapiens justifiable to all of those responsible for upholding such norms? This is to ask, in effect, whether certain demands of recognition respect for humans-qua-H. sapiens are justifiable to all of those the demands address. According to Darwall’s view in The Second-Person Standpoint, such demands must be justifiable from the “second-person” perspective—that is, the perspective of anyone who can make and heed legitimate, authoritative demands (2006: 271–2). This is a part of what’s distinctive about recognition respect, including recognition respect for human rights: It involves the putative assertion and acceptance of practical, claim-making authority. Such authority cannot be accepted as legitimate unless it is justifiable from the second-person perspective. Are norms that call for recognition respect for all and only members of the human, H. sapiens kind justified in this way? I have difficulty seeing how, unless they designate something else about membership in this social kind that is normatively significant. From the second-person perspective, the species boundary is arbitrary, as is the fact that global practices have drawn the outlines of the social kind to match it. This is one way to develop the “speciesism” worry raised by Peter Singer and others against views that defend the special moral status of humans. Killmister replies to this worry by pointing out that no harm need be done to non-humans by accepting norms that call for a special kind of recognition respect for humans-qua-H. sapiens (151–2). Fair enough, but this doesn’t deal with the main issue at hand: Are the norms justifiable, i.e., more than arbitrary, from the second-person perspective shared by those addressed by these norms of recognition respect?

Killmister might worry that any satisfactory, second-personal justification of these norms will end up privileging certain characteristics of human beings—their capacities for rational agency, autonomy, or what Darwall calls “second-personal competence”—and thus exclude some of the individuals that human dignity (and rights) norms are supposed to protect (155). But this ignores, first, that there are accounts of these characteristics that may be sufficiently capacious.[1] And it ignores, second, alternative ways of justifying the norms that are suggested by some of what Killmister says—namely, thinking systematically about the moral purposes that the global practice of human rights for H. sapiens achieves. Perhaps a H. sapiens-centered global practice is the best we can do to achieve important forms of protection for all persons—to, e.g., avoid the monstrous abuses that spurred the formation of twentieth-century human rights pacts—even though the biological species-boundary is an imperfect way of demarcating the relevant sense of “person.”[2]

In sum, Killmister’s book provides a fresh and stimulating conception of dignity. It opens the door to novel and, I think, productive ways of theorizing about a diverse array of dignitarian and related moral phenomena. I am not convinced that she selects the right desiderata for a theory of dignity, or that her theory adequately deals with pressing questions about norm-justification. But I do think that moral philosophers will benefit from considering the theoretical possibilities opened up by her account, as I have.


Darwall, Stephen (2006). The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Korsgaard, Christine (1996). The Sources of Normativity. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Korsgaard, Christine (2009). Self-Constitution: Agency, Identity, and Integrity. New York: Oxford University Press.


[1] See, e.g., Agnieszka Jaworska and Julie Tannenbaum, “Person-Rearing Relationships as a Key to Higher Moral Status,” Ethics 124 (2014): 242–271, and Adam Cureton, “Ideals of Respect: Identity, Dignity and Disability,” in Ethics in Practice: An Anthology (5th Edition), ed. Hugh LaFollette (Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2020).

[2] Note, though, that this kind of pragmatic justification may not end up fitting within the strictures of second-personal justifiability—for some discussion of this, see Ariel Zylberman, “Why Human Rights? Because of You,” Journal of Political Philosophy 24 (2016): 321–343.