Contract, Culture, and Citizenship: Transformative Liberalism from Hobbes to Rawls

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Mark E. Button, Contract, Culture, and Citizenship: Transformative Liberalism from Hobbes to Rawls, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008, 269pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271033815.

Reviewed by Anna Stilz, Princeton University


Mark Button offers a rereading of the classical social contract tradition that highlights its desire to shape the opinions, habits, and identities of liberal citizens. Button's focus on these educative themes is important and refreshing, especially since he traces these issues in Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and Rawls, rather than in someone like Hegel, whose contributions on this subject have been more widely recognized. The main argument of Button's book is that "contract makes citizens" and not the other way around. The book seeks to "reveal the extent to which political justification depends on an ethics of character formation" (9), and highlights the ways in which the liberal project is one of cultural transformation, not just normative theory. Social contract theorists, according to Button, are just as concerned to "form … the very citizens who are presupposed by a contract" (223) as they are to explicate the content of that contract itself.

The thrust of Button's retelling is thus rather different than the traditional social contract narrative, which sees the central problem of that tradition as one of stating the conditions under which the state's authority can be morally justified. A morally justified state, according to this narrative, would possess a special right to rule. Most existing states already act like they have this right: they pass laws that direct our conduct and enforce them. Most of our fellow-citizens also act like the state has this right: they obey the law and do what the state requires without being coerced to do so. But citizens might wonder: is it really so? Does the state really have a right to rule? In the usual telling, the social contract theorists answer this question by outlining the conditions under which the state would have a (moral) right to rule.

One central thesis of the social contract tradition's answer is: a state is morally legitimate when we can offer a justification of its rule to each particular citizen. That means that we can give each citizen a set of good reasons for having that state in place, reasons that show the state to be choiceworthy for each person. Only if we can give that kind of account can the state be said to have the right to rule that we attribute to it. When citizens raise questions about the legitimacy of their state, then, we must ask whether this kind of justification is available to them.

Button's book does not so much contradict this traditional narrative as show that it needs to be supplemented, by drawing our attention to the ways in which social contract theorists were (and still are) also engaged in an important project of socio-cultural transformation. According to Button, Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and Rawls are crucially concerned with sources of civic virtue, with the ways in which liberal regimes might form good citizens. Although Button's book is not the first to draw our attention to the transformative ambitions of some of the theorists he treats (I think here of David Johnston's work on Hobbes and Bryan Garsten's work on persuasion in Hobbes, Rousseau, and Rawls, among others), his readings of these theorists are interesting and largely compelling.

In Chapter 2, Button makes the case that Hobbes sought to establish a sovereign arbitrator whose "public reason" could serve as the rule of right and wrong for his subjects, by resolving the ethical controversies that would otherwise lead them to war. But the "public reason" of Hobbes's sovereign state does not just seek to guide individuals' external behavior; it goes beyond this to regulate the habits and opinions of its subjects through a program of civic education. By teaching subjects the grounds of the sovereign's rights in universities and public assemblies, the Hobbesian state attempts to shape their opinions and ensure that they will adopt the sovereign's "public reason" as their own.

In Chapters 3 and 4, Button argues that Locke is likewise concerned to use civic education in order to form citizens to be good judges, able to discern when the government has acted outside its trust and contravened natural law. In order to be good judges, citizens must be capable of reasoning and discerning the content of that natural law for themselves. But Locke emphasizes how demanding the discernment of natural law is, and how prone human beings are to confuse its content with the opinions and customs generally prevailing in their society. Here, Button argues that Locke wishes to use the force of habit and custom against itself, by educating citizens into new rational habits of criticism and autonomy. But Button worries that Locke's educational methods rely on incentives of shame, esteem, and deference to authority in ways that mimic the very sources of custom he seeks to combat. Here, Button wonders: can habit ever be made rational? Can a project of civic formation (which shapes its subjects without their knowledge) truly facilitate citizens' autonomy?

Finally, in Chapters 5 and 6, Button shows how these themes reemerge in Rousseau and Rawls. Button argues that while Rousseau formally accepts that his sovereign people are not bound by any higher laws, in fact he tacitly relies on the moeurs and customs inculcated by a legislator to provide content to their democratic legislation. Rousseau's general will is thus dependent on a background of cultural practices that educates citizens into particular habits and dispositions. Likewise, according to Button, Rawls's account of public reason similarly relies on citizens who have been educated to share a "sense of justice." The liberal state must inculcate its citizens with dispositions to act reasonably and to address their fellow citizens with reasons they can be expected to share.

While Button does not provide a single, unitary account of why it is so important for the liberal state to shape its citizens' characters, at least three themes emerge from his narrative:

1) Fashioning citizens' character is necessary to create citizens who can hold themselves to their promises and obligations. Since liberal regimes are legitimated by consent, citizens need to have the faculties and dispositions necessary to consent to their state and follow through on that consent.

2) Fashioning citizens' character is necessary in order for citizens to be motivated to comply with liberal institutions, and therefore to sustain these institutions over time and give them stability.

3) Fashioning citizens' character is necessary in order to allow them to make autonomous judgments free from the influence of tradition, custom, or the potentially false opinions of other people. Since one principle of a liberal regime is that it seeks to justify itself "at the tribunal of each person's reason,"[1] liberal citizens need to be capable of reasoning for themselves in order to evaluate the regimes under which they live.

We should note that these three reasons why the liberal state might shape citizens' characters are rather different in kind. Some of them might be more legitimate than others: in particular, while (1) and (2) point toward the need to educate citizens to affirm a particular set of institutions, (3) simply points toward the need for an education in critical thinking, which may or may not result in the affirmation of particular institutions. I will not try to sort out which reasons for character formation are most compelling, however. Instead, I wish to briefly draw our attention to a possible paradox that the effort at character formation might generate. I will call this the Paradox of Manufactured Affirmation.

Imagine that a particular citizen asks the question of whether her state has the right to rule. According to the social contract tradition, her state is legitimate if we can offer that citizen (and her fellows) a moral justification for its rule that could be made acceptable to her. But suppose, along Button's lines, that our citizen has already been educated and formed by the state, with an eye towards fostering her willing acceptance of its rule. In that case, we might question whether her acceptance of the state gives us any independent reason to think that its rule is (objectively) legitimate. She might accept the state, but tyrants also shape docile slaves who willingly accept their rule. Why should manufactured affirmation on the part of citizens give us more reason to think the state has a right to rule than the manufactured affirmation of the slave gives us to think the tyrant has a right to rule?

One way of responding to this concern would be to separate the justification of the state's right to rule from the question of what motivations and character traits citizens need to have in order to sustain a stable state over time. Perhaps the question of whether the state has a right to rule is one that we can answer simply by referring to objective moral criteria. If the state meets these criteria, it is (morally) legitimate, even if its citizens do not accept it. And if it does not meet these criteria, it is illegitimate, even if they do accept it. On this view, it might still be prudent for just states to shape citizens to willingly comply with their laws and to abide by certain principles of public justification. This would generate a degree of sociological legitimacy that could help sustain a just state over time. But nothing about the state's moral legitimacy depends on its citizens' beliefs or their willing acceptance of its rule -- citizens could just be wrong about their state. To take this line would mean adopting a Kantian view of legitimacy which references "a regulative and 'eternal norm' that need not have any resonance or purchase with actual citizens" (10). In the introduction, Button declares himself opposed to such an approach.

Instead, at the end of the book, he seeks to respond to concerns about whether character formation is consistent with autonomy and freedom by suggesting that liberal states should adopt an ethos of "democratic humility." Rather than a "one-directional" influence of the state on its citizens' characters, Button wishes to see the terms of political discourse and civic education continually transformed through the activity of citizens themselves. One way this might occur is by greater attentiveness to excluded perspectives and marginalized claims. This might draw citizens' attention to the ways in which their characters and dispositions are falsely naturalized. But it was hard for me to see exactly how "democratic humility" could reshape or undo the kind of civic formation that Button himself advocates elsewhere in the book. Whether or not "democratic humility" can be defended against this criticism, however, Button's book remains an original and important investigation into the history of civic education in the social contract tradition. Political theorists will find much that is of interest here.

[1] Jeremy Waldron, "Theoretical Foundations of Liberalism," in Philosophical Quarterly 37 (1987): 127-50.