Contractualism and the Foundations of Morality

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Nicholas Southwood, Contractualism and the Foundations of Morality, Oxford University Press, 2010, 216pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199539659.

Reviewed by Kevin Vallier, Bowling Green State University


Nicholas Southwood has set himself an ambitious task: provide an account of the foundations of morality in two hundred pages. By "morality" Southwood means "the complete set of facts (or truths) about what morality requires of us -- that is, the complete set of facts (or truths) about which token acts are morally permissible, impermissible, and obligatory." (7) Despite somewhat circumscribing his subject matter, he promises much. To evaluate his promise, let's begin with a summary of his book.

I. How to Discover the Foundations of Morality

Southwood offers a contractualist explanation of the foundations of morality. In other words, he wishes to provide an "ultimate explanation" of why acts are permissible, prohibited or obligatory by giving agreement a "privileged role" in determining moral requirements (3). Towards that end, he postulates a "grounding relation" between a contractualist formula and moral principles. The grounding relation delivers an "ultimate constitutive explanation" that both explains and determines what counts as moral. A constitutive explanation of the moral facts "explains what makes acts morally permissible, impermissible, and obligatory," and implies a necessary connection between the explanans and explanandum (10). The explanation is ultimate because it "is not itself explained by some such further fact or principle" or to reach "explanatory rock-bottom." (11)

Southwood develops a test for determining whether an account of morality's foundations is true. It has two criteria:

1. The moral accuracy criterion: It must be sufficiently faithful to the intensional and extensional character of the moral facts.

2. The explanatory adequacy criterion: It must be appropriately explanatory with respect to the moral facts. (12)

First, let's explain the moral accuracy criterion, which requires a vindication of morality's "intensional" and "extensional" character. A moral theory must vindicate morality's putative normativity, elucidating the authority of moral reasoning, and its objectivity, accounting for its other-regarding character. In doing so, a moral theory justifies morality's "intensional" character. A moral theory has the right "extensional" character only when it is impartial and allows for persons to pursue their own partial projects and plans.

Second, let's consider the explanatory adequacy criterion. This criterion is met negatively, by showing that other theories are inadequate in a number of different ways. For instance, Southwood dispatches Scanlon's contractualism, rooted in the criterion of reasonable rejectability, for being explanatorily backward. Since it is explanatorily backward, it fails to be an adequate account of morality's foundations because it does not truly explain the moral facts. This "Kantian" contractualism is explanatorily backward because it is explanatorily "circular". It assumes what it is supposed to explain, and it is explanatorily non-fundamental because it presupposes "explanatorily more fundamental considerations" independent of the Kantian contract model (53). In short, a norm is only reasonably rejectable if it is immoral, it is not immoral because it is reasonably rejectable.

The moral accuracy criterion and the explanatory adequacy criterion are the twin blades of the book. Southwood first uses them to dispatch his two main rivals -- Hobbesian and Kantian contractualisms. Hobbesian contractualism fails the moral accuracy criterion, and Kantian contractualism fails the explanatory adequacy criterion. Southwood then uses the criteria to defend his preferred version of contractualism, deliberative contractualism (DC).

DC is grounded in a "deliberative" conception of rationality, a type of rationality "constituted by deliberative norms that we presuppose when we engage in deliberation with others." (2) Specifically, Southwood tells us:

The central thesis of deliberative contractualism is that morality's foundations are to be located in facts about hypothetical, deliberatively rational agreements regarding the terms upon which we are to be permitted, forbidden, and required to conduct ourselves toward others (3).

Readers who detect Habermasian elements in this claim are right to do so, for Southwood acknowledges "important affinities" with Habermas and other deliberative democrats. Indeed, the book can be read as an attempt to apply the justificatory structure of deliberative democracy to contractualist moral theory.

I will not review Southwood's criticisms of Hobbesian and Kantian contractualism. Let me note, however, that he clearly and creatively builds on other persuasive criticisms of these views. Instead, allow me to focus on Southwood's positive account, which I believe raises a number of concerns.

II. Deliberative Contractualism

As we have seen, DC bases morality's foundations on facts about "what common code we would agree to live by if we were . . . perfectly deliberatively rational." (86) A course of action is deliberatively rational when the agent who takes the action "fully complies with the relevant deliberative norms" which are presupposed by deliberating as such. A deliberative norm is "one in which deliberative considerations are somehow central to the kind of normative appraisal that the norm licenses" or to put it another way, these norms "express what it is to be a good deliberator, what it is to deliberate properly" (92). Contractualist duties derive from "a hypothetical choice situation" where agents act on deliberative norms alone.

The resulting view is neither too personal nor impersonal but "interpersonal," evaluating the moral world "from the standpoint of a participant in an intersubjective process involving other persons who are distinct but similarly situated." (87) It is intersubjective inasmuch as it is deliberative;, that is, justification is between persons, and so neither individual nor independent of persons. Further, it is "procedural" rather than substantive while remaining "normatively rich." It is procedural because to be deliberately rational is nothing more than to comply with the deliberative procedure and it is normatively rich because there really are "demanding standards of deliberative rationality that must be met in order for individuals to count as rational in the relevant sense" (87).

According to Southwood, persons share a capacity for complying with the demands of deliberative rationality insofar as they see themselves as possessing "deliberative citizenship" (88). The ideal of deliberative citizenship is "marked by authority and mutual accountability, expressed in our being simultaneously potential co-legislators and co-subjects," so the metaphor of citizenship is apt (128).

Given its centrality, let's focus on Southwood's conception of deliberative rationality. Southwood claims "a decision to perform an act is deliberatively rational just in case the decision is based on the outcome of deliberation with others who are affected by the decision that fully complies with relevant deliberative norms." (89) This means the decision must satisfy three conditions: (i) the decision must be based on persons deliberating with one another prior to making a decision, (ii) the decision must be made by complying fully with the deliberative norms and (iii) the decision must follow the outcome of such deliberation.

Deliberative norms come in three kinds: communicative, discursive and reflective. These norms correspond to three of our roles as deliberative citizens. The communicative norms require us to openly exchange relevant information, to be sincere, to effectively transmit our views and to make ourselves understood. We must also be open to other views, listen well and be prepared to resolve conflicts (93). The discursive norms require us to engage in persuasion and argumentation and to aim for consensus. Finally, reflective norms require us to willingly explore our own commitments and try to make them internally consistent.

If we comply with the deliberative norms, then we will settle on additional norms that themselves form the content of a common behavioral code, a "relatively comprehensive set of common principles, permitting, forbidding, and requiring certain conduct in certain circumstances." (102) What goes into the process? "The full range of attitudes that are constitutive of our particular first-personal standpoints" that is attitudes "constructed out of our particular beliefs." (97). The output is the substantive content of morality.

III. The Defense of Deliberative Contractualism

Southwood defends DC in two steps. In Chapter 5, he explains how and why deliberative contractualist agreements can provide us with normative reasons (118). Then in Chapters 6 and 7, he argues that DC uniquely satisfies the moral accuracy and explanatory adequacy criteria.

Southwood argues for the normativity of DC by claiming that we must see ourselves as deliberative agents and thus subject to the constitutive norms of deliberative agency. As he puts it, by being deliberative agents we presuppose "that we stand in a certain normatively significant relation to others, and that we have reasons that express the demands of this relation" (119). However, these reasons are not third-personal or impersonal. Rather he claims, following Stephen Darwall, that they are "second-personal," meaning that they flow from our status as co-deliberators, and essentially include shared authority and mutual accountability relations. From this standpoint arise "reasons of deliberative citizenship" arise which requires honoring this shared authority and accountability.

Chapter 6 purportedly shows that DC satisfies the moral accuracy criterion by demonstrating that it vindicates both morality's intensional and extensional character. First, Southwood argues that the DC model provides reasons that are categorically binding and other-regarding. He then argues that morality is objective in the sense that it is entailed by deliberative norms that constitute deliberative agency as such. Then, by combining the partial and impartial elements of moral principles and rules, DC vindicates the extensional character of morality. For example, DC can readily explain how we can permissibly prioritize promoting the well-being of those persons we have close connections with while still requiring that we aid strangers.

In Chapter 7, Southwood defends DC's explanatory adequacy, the claim that DC provides an adequate, informative explanation of morality's normative force. Here his case is largely defensive. He proceeds by claiming that DC is not explanatorily backwards, explanatorily superseded, explanatorily epiphenomenal, explanatorily circular or explanatorily non-fundamental. I cannot review all of Southwood's replies, but I believe they are important and advance the dialogue between contractualists and their critics. In particular, I think attractive Southwood's attempt to ground moral normativity in deliberative normativity, the latter of which seems to have enough independent normative content to avoid explanatory circularity.

In the end, Southwood concludes "I hope that . . . I have shown at least that deliberative contractualism is an account of morality's foundations that deserves to be given serious consideration" (191). Before raising criticisms, let me say that I think he has accomplished this task.

IV. DC Probably Fails the Moral Accuracy Criterion

I will now argue that DC fails the moral accuracy criterion. It fails to vindicate both morality's intensional character and its extensional character. DC fails the former because it has no resources to show that our status as deliberative agents should override reasons deriving from other self-conceptions. DC fails the latter because the deliberative model has indeterminate outputs and so cannot be assumed to generate clear extensional results.

One hazard of DC is that it is rooted in an explicit analogy with Habermas's deliberative democratic approach to political philosophy. As such, it rests on an analogy with a conception of political citizenship, namely deliberative citizenship. But deliberative citizenship has a rather artificial feel, even in light of the fact that Southwood at one point describes it as a metaphor (128). Granted, Kant's own moral philosophy is based partly in a conception of rational beings as members of a "kingdom of ends," but Southwood has something more specific in mind. Deliberative norms are grounded in our conception of ourselves as deliberative citizens, not the broader conception of a rational agent on which Kant and Kantians traditionally rely.

This raises the question of how the obligations of deliberative citizenship stack up against obligations associated with other roles. After all, I have many self-conceptions, including conceptions of myself as a human being, a son, a husband, an American citizen, and as a professional philosopher. Each of these self-conceptions implies implicit norms associated with taking the role in question. But my self-conceptions can conflict. Most people's conception of themselves as deliberative citizens -- if they conceive of themselves in this way at all -- may not be their most fundamental self-conception. And if so, when self-conceptions conflict, non-deliberative self-conceptions may be judged more important, and rationally so. Thus, their associated norms will take precedence.

It will follow that deliberative citizenship fails to adequately characterize the foundations of morality, as it cannot explain the categoricity and bindingness of morality. If morality is rooted in deliberative citizenship, and I can rationally prioritize other self-conceptions over my deliberative citizenship, then the norms of deliberative citizenship can be overridden too easily to count as categorical or binding. All we will be able to say is that insofar as I take my conception of myself as a deliberative citizen as fundamental to my identity that I have reason to comply with moral norms. So it seems that DC fails to account for morality's intensional character, and thereby fails the moral accuracy criterion. Southwood could remedy this concern by providing an argument that deliberative citizenship is fundamental to my identity, but no such argument appears in the book.

DC probably fails the moral accuracy criterion in a second way as well, since it fails to vindicate morality's extensional character. For Southwood, a moral theory vindicates the extensional character of morality when it generates moral norms that balance partiality and impartiality in a single common code. But DC is inadequate to this task, for Southwood provides us with little if any reason to suppose that deliberative contractors will be able to agree on a determinate, common code. Returning to political philosophy for a moment, recall that in Political Liberalism, Rawls begins by observing that the free exercise of practical reason leads to significant disagreement rather than agreement about matters of ultimate importance, on both matters of good and right (xix).

Consequently, members of a well-ordered society may rationally and reasonably adopt liberal conceptions of justice other than justice as fairness, though justice as fairness remains the most reasonable conception. Gerald Gaus pushes this theme further in The Order of Public Reason. If the free exercise of practical reason leads to disagreement, then surely citizens can disagree about which principles and rules are most reasonable. Thus, while they may agree that a certain set of rules or codes are potentially justifiable, deliberators will be unable to agree on which member of the set is best, given their diverse values, beliefs and other commitments (43). The lesson of the political liberal tradition is that disagreement is the rule, not the exception.

But Southwood consistently downplays the importance of moral disagreement, largely dismissing its importance. For instance, he mentions off-handedly that "apparent normative disagreement is often based on non-normative disagreement (101, n. 31). He later claims that rational contractors will have enough information and good deliberative manners to reveal that they deeply agree about morality (165). But this reply is insufficient, as concerns about moral disagreement occupy entire subfields in moral and political philosophy. Reasonable pluralism was enough to worry Rawls, Habermas and Gaus, so it should worry Southwood as well.

To be more specific, Southwood should worry that his contractors will be plagued by what Rawls called the burdens of judgment (PL, 54). They will disagree due to the vagueness of moral concepts, differing opinions about the weighting of various moral values and the difficulty of evaluating empirical information. Further, if Southwood's contractors remotely resemble ordinary deliberative agents, their reasoning will invariably be path-dependent -- their judgments will differ based on the order in which they confront and process different considerations that count in favor of some rule or code. Gaus has argued that even fully rational deliberators will be subject to indeterminate reasoning (OPR, 235-43). In lieu of direct engagement with reasonable disagreement, we cannot determine whether DC has clear outputs and so we cannot determine whether it vindicates the extensional character of morality. It follows that DC fails the moral accuracy criterion and so fails as an adequate account of the foundations of morality. Southwood cannot avoid a more serious engagement with moral disagreement.

Southwood could reply by acknowledging that deliberative contractors are free to accept any code that satisfies the relevant criteria. But this means grappling with a difficult problem: different contractors may rank different codes differently, in which case they might be bound by a code they regard as sub-optimal. Habermas, Rawls and Gaus all think accounting for the normative authority of codes subject to pervasive disagreement requires serious theoretical work. Southwood, however, does not even acknowledge the challenge.

In sum, Southwood succeeds in his modest task of showing that deliberative contractualism ought to be a contender among contractualist moral theories. But there is much more to be done to make the view plausible. As we have seen, he must explain both (a) why a person's deliberative citizenship has fundamental normative weight and (b) why deliberative contractors will reach determinate conclusions despite systematic and deep moral disagreement.