Contrastive Reasons

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Justin Snedegar, Contrastive Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2017, 149pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198785934.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, University of London


Suppose I think the fact that I will soon be fired is a reason for me not to touch my savings. That's an obvious thought to have. Suppose I also think the fact that I will soon be fired is a reason for me not to touch my savings rather than to blow them all on drink. Another obvious thought to have. Now suppose I think the fact that I will soon be fired is a reason for me not to touch my savings rather than invest them in acquiring new skills. That sounds less obvious. The reasons I can plausibly consider myself to have would seem to depend on particular features of the context. Yet how, exactly, do reasons depend on features of the context? One proposal, expertly defended by Justin Snedegar, is that there are no such things as (pro tanto) reasons merely as such, or reasons simpliciter. All (pro tanto) reasons are reasons only relative to some set of alternatives. Thus, if you have reasons not to spread fake news, the reasons that speak in favour of your not doing so may obtain relative to one set of alternatives, such as making up news stories to suit your cause, or indiscriminately 'liking' every item on your newsfeed that mocks people you don't like. It does not follow that those reasons obtain relative to some other set of alternatives, such as letting the forces of evil win in a war of propaganda, or preventing the collapse of human society as we know it.

As Snedegar notes, saying that reasons obtain relative to a set of alternatives is just one among many ways of claiming that reasons obtain relative to features of the context (p.8). Yet it is a highly distinctive version of that claim, and one that deserves to be examined on its own merits. Although it is arguably too brief and leaves too many loose ends to constitute a comprehensive treatment of this topic, this book is worthy of careful study for anyone with a serious interest the nature of reasons and normativity.

Snedegar's contrastive view of reasons is both 'moderate' and 'deep'. It is 'deep' because it is not only a view about the language (or 'semantics') of reason ascriptions, but also a metaphysical view about 'the important (possibly fundamental) normative reason -- or favouring -- relation' (p. 89). It is 'moderate', because the inferential relations between reasons across the different alternatives to which those reasons are relative is made possible by the existence of non-contrastive facts about the 'promotion' of reason grounding 'objectives'. (The question of whether we should also go 'contrastivist' at the level of objectives is non-conclusively treated in Chapter 5.) In a nutshell, the basic claim is that 'r is a reason to A, relative to a set of alternatives Q, explained or provided by objective O, when r explains why A-ing better promotes O than any other alternative in Q' (p. 81; cf. pp. 82, 84). (The clause about A better promoting O than any other alternative is there to rule out that 'one fact could be both a reason to A and a reason not to A, when both are explained by the same objective' (p.81). This is 'the principle of Restricted Exclusivity'.)

Consider something you are willing to treat as a normatively salient end-state of rational activity. For the sake of illustration, let it be 'no-one spreading fake news'. Call this 'O'. Among all the possible things you could do, some of them are relevant to the promotion of that end state, and some of them are not. Relative to O, it is only the former class that are genuine alternatives. Call these 'Q'. Whether or not to 'like' the next post in your newsfeed is clearly (somewhat) relevant to the promotion of O, whereas whether or not to empty the dustbin in the next thirty minutes is (probably) not. Now consider the relevant action, A, of 'liking' the next post in your newsfeed, and two considerations, r1 and r2 that may, or may not, be reasons for doing so. First, let r1 be that you have not 'liked' anything yet today. Let r2 be that the item in question is an item that warns people about spreading fake news. The question is then whether either of r1 or r2 is a reason for you to 'like' the item in question, i.e., to A. According to the contrastive view, this is a question of whether or not r1 or r2 explains why 'liking' the item in question better promotes the objective of no-one spreading fake news than any of the relevant alternatives in Q, such as ignoring it. In the case of r1, things look bleak. It is implausible that the fact that you have not 'liked' anything today explains why it is the case that 'liking' the news item in question would be more likely to lead to no-one spreading fake news than the relevant alternatives. In the case of r2, things look better. The fact that the item in question is a warning against the spread of fake news is at least a candidate to explain why 'liking' the item would be more likely to lead to no-one spreading fake news than the alternative of simply ignoring it, say. It is a candidate to explain this, if not because 'liking' the item could have some minimal effect with respect to promoting the objective of no-one spreading fake news, then because the expressive significance of 'liking' it has at least something to do with the content of that objective. The fact that you have not yet 'liked' anything today would seem to be neither here nor there with respect to that issue.

As Snedegar also notes, much of the existing literature on reasons seems to implicitly assume that there are reasons simpliciter. On a natural way of interpreting this assumption, deliberating agents are confronted with reasons that obtain in mutual independence, and with an action-guiding salience provided by nothing else than their intrinsic normative significance. Thus, as I think hard about fake news and the cherished values it is arguably inconsistent with, I may come to believe -- as a good Kantian, for example - that I have to be against it. According to the contrastive view, nothing is really ever a reason just like that, but only relative to a given reference class of 'exclusive', or 'rationally incompatible' alternatives. This claim, if true, could be a potential corrective with respect to much traditional theorising about reasons; not only with respect to how to best describe how it is that we can have the reasons we have, but also with respect to what we think those reasons are. For example, it is natural to think that acceptance of a contrastive view might encourage us to be more alert to actually considering some relevant alternatives, at least in certain circumstances.

Snedegar makes a strong case for the claim that we should take the contrastive view very seriously. In a short section of Chapter 1 (a bit too short for my taste), he points out that there is a good case for adopting a contrastive view in areas of thought that have more than a superficial similarity to talk about reasons. The most obvious example is the case of explanation, for which some very influential contrastive accounts already exist in the literature (as developed by Bas van Fraassen and others). Among the most obvious connections between talk of reasons and talk of explanation is that one very natural way to interpret talk about reasons (including reasons for action) is to interpret it as talk that consists in giving and asking for explanations, albeit (at least in some paradigm cases) explanations of a distinctively normative kind. This is hardly surprising, given that both reasons and explanations deal with the question 'Why?' in a perfectly unproblematic sense of that word. Snedegar stops short of exploring the connections between reasons and explanation, partly out of what I suspect is an undue respect for the so-called 'reasons first' approach to normativity (p. 20-21). Be that as it may, the epistemological and metaphysical implications of the potential entanglement between talk of reasons and talk of explanation could be a fruitful avenue for further work on this topic.

Just as importantly, and quite independently of any wider theoretical considerations, the contrastive view promises to offer an account of a number of controversies the intrinsic interest of which has nothing to do with the contrastive view as such. First, the contrastive view offers an explanation of how it could be plausible to think that the 'more reason than' relation (not the 'reason' relation) is intransitive. (This is the topic of Chapter 5.) Second, the contrastive view offers an explanation of how it can sometimes be rational to consciously withhold a belief or intention in the absence of conclusive reasons pointing either way. (This is the topic of Chapter 6.) Anyone who has a serious interest in either the topic of transitivity or the topic of witholding will benefit from studying Snedegar's subtle treatment of these issues.

It was not clear to me from reading this book exactly what is supposed to be at stake in either asserting or denying that some consideration is a pro tanto reason (however weak), as opposed to no reason at all, for something. (I am hardly the first person to raise the issue.) I personally find it hard to form a strong view. Perhaps it is a case of 'spoils to the victor', and so to be worked out in the columns of a philosophical 'balance sheet', as Snedegar seems to do when he claims that something can only be a reason for action when it explains why the action it is a reason for will better promote a salient objective than any other alternative, this being necessary in order to respect the principle of Restricted Exclusivity. An alternative view, but one I suspect that Snedegar would not be very keen on (see e.g. p.90), is to insist that this is at least partly a substantial normative question, about the 'ethics' (broadly speaking) of what we should be prepared to think and say. Thus, if we take seriously the idea that our normative standing is affected by the content of our propositional attitudes, we may want to restrict the range of considerations that we are prepared to countenance as even the weakest pro tanto reasons on the grounds that they are just too offensive or ridiculous to entertain, or that they otherwise ought to be 'silenced' from deliberation (such as the claim that I have a reason -- however weak -- to decapitate my enemies and place their heads on sticks, or - more familiar from the recent reasons literature - to eat my car.)

Nor was it clear to me what the wider implications are of explaining the relevance of alternative courses of action in terms of the promotion of objectives. As Snedegar duly observes (pp. 68-69; 87-88), there is a long tradition of skepticism about whether all the things we want to say about reasons are best expressed in terms of the promotion of values, as opposed to respecting or honouring norms or principles, objects (including people, such as oneself), or states of affairs. One response is to say that it is 'theoretically unattractive to posit two separate reason relations' (p. 69); but, as we all know, that's just talk. Another option is to explain away the inconvenient data by saying that 'different alternatives can do better or worse at respecting or honouring values', with a bunch of alternatives potentially being tied at the bottom as not respecting those values at all (p. 88). The underlying claim here is that, with suitable technical ingenuity, anything we might reasonably want to say in terms of 'respecting' and 'honouring' can be suitably represented in terms of 'promoting values'. But that is not the only point at issue. At least one other point at issue is how we should deliberate about what do to and why we should do it. If thinking exclusively in the language of value promotion implies the exclusion from deliberative view of some genuine reasons (such as those that have traditionally been thought of as distinctively 'deontic'), then any promotion-based representation of such reasons will be at best optional, and at worst wrong. Having said that, it can hardly be held against Snedegar that he avoids taking on this big challenge in this short book.

Finally, it was not clear to me exactly how we are supposed to think about the nature and status of objectives. Snedegar is deliberatively vague on this topic. At one point he notes that we do need some account of the relative importance of the various 'reason-providing objectives', but then cheerfully admits that he has none (p. 104). At another point he suggests that we can treat objectives alternatively as objects of desire, as values or reason giving ends, or perhaps something else if we prefer (e.g. p. 68). No doubt it would be very convenient, from a contrastive point of view, if we were able to treat objectives as a kind of a meta-normatively neutral plug-in, but I am not convinced either that we can, or that we should. In particular, it is not clear to me that the question of what the reason-providing objectives are, and so of what the relevant alternatives are, and so of what the relevant reasons are, is asymmetrically independent of either what the relevant alternatives are, or, indeed, of what the relevant reasons are. (This point is relevant to the discussion in Chapter 5 of how 'deep' the contrastive view should go.) Although there is nothing intrinsically incoherent about the circularity involved in fixing the reason-providing objectives with reference to the reasons to which they are supposed to give rise via the relevant set of alternatives, there is a question lurking here about where exactly that leaves the guiding thought that claims about reasons can be contrastively grounded in claims about reason-providing objectives.