Contrastivism in Philosophy

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Martijn Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy, Routledge, 2012, 177pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415878609.

Reviewed by Peter Baumann, Swarthmore College


Contrastivism about some relation F claims that F has at least one more relatum than usually thought, and that the additional relatum consists of a contrast class (typically of propositions). For instance, contrastivists about (propositional) knowledge hold that knowledge is not a two-place relation between a person and a proposition but a three-place relation between a person, a proposition known and a set of contrast propositions. I don't just know that this is a piece of cheese; I know that it's cheese rather than marmalade but I don't know it's cheese rather than a very well done tofu imitation of cheese. A few decades ago, contrastivism was developed by philosophers of science and applied to matters of explanation and confirmation. About a decade ago, contrastivist views of knowledge and other epistemic notions emerged. Contrastivism about moral notions is a bit more recent. This anthology contains (apart from a brief introduction) articles on contrastivist views of explanation (Christopher Hitchcock), causation (Jonathan Schaffer), confirmation (Branden Fitelson), belief (Martijn Blaauw), knowledge (Adam Morton), deontic modals (Justin Snedegar), freedom (Walter Sinnott-Armstrong) and moral luck (Julia Driver). The papers are in general very well written and accessible to non-specialists; they combine overviews with important, original research. Given the trend towards compartmentalization of philosophical sub-areas an anthology of this kind is very welcome.

"Contrastive Explanation" by Christopher Hitchcock, one of the champions of contrastivism in the philosophy of science, is a very clearly written article that can also serve as an introduction to theories of explanation, with a focus on and defense of contrastive explanation (including but not restricted to causal explanation). Hitchcock argues that contrasts can occur both in the explanans and in the explanandum. "Adam ate the apple because he was hungry" can be short for "Adam ate the apple, rather than giving it back to Eve, because he was hungry". Similarly, "Smith was arrested because she stole the bicycle" can be short for "Smith was arrested because she stole the bicycle, rather than buying it" (17), or even for "Smith was arrested, rather than let off with a warning, because she stole the bicycle, rather than the tennis ball". Hitchcock also offers a classification of different types of explanation (19-24). It is a matter for debate, though, whether contrastivism is equally plausible for all kinds of explanation (e.g., for mathematical explanations). Contrastivism about explanation is a revisionary view also insofar as the relativity to contrast classes turns explanation into a somewhat limited project: we would have to give up the idea of an unrelativized, "complete" explanation of some phenomenon.

Jonathan Schaffer who may well have developed contrastivism about "knowledge" more than anyone else follows with the very well argued "Causal Contextualism". Schaffer is the only contributor who explicitly takes a stand on contextualism.[1] He takes it as uncontroversial that causal claims are sensitive to the context of the attributor of the causal relation (35-36): Consider, e.g., "The poor road conditions caused the accident" vs. "The drunkenness of the driver caused the accident", as uttered in different contexts (35). Schaffer argues that what shifts with context are contrast classes rather than defaults or models (45-46). Contrast classes can specify causes as well as effects, like in "John's being bold rather than timid caused him to kiss Mary rather than merely waving goodnight" (51). Schaffer also takes great care to show that the context-sensitivity of such contrastive claims is not just pragmatic but (at least) partly semantic. He offers linguistic data supporting the latter claim (37-40) and a range of problems for pragmatic (i.e., Gricean) accounts (42-44). More serious for Schaffer is a pair of final worries (which are worries not just for the contextualist). It is not clear what the source of the contrast classes can be (56-57). Furthermore, since "cause" is no indexical and also does not seem to bring with it a covert variable for contrasts, it is not clear at all what other semantic options there remain for the contrastivist.[2]

Branden Fitelson's "Contrastive Bayesianism" could raise the expectation of a wedding of Bayesianism and contrastivism. However, Fitelson criticizes views of confirmation which are "contrastivist" insofar as they use the idea of some evidence E favoring one hypothesis H1 over another hypothesis H2 (see sec.3 on likelihoodism). Fitelson offers a stimulating discussion of the problem of irrelevant conjunction (sec.4). If E confirms H (with H entailing E), then presumably it also confirms H & X (for any X); he criticizes contrastivist solutions of the problem. Fitelson ends (sec.5) with an interesting discussion of the conjunction fallacy (see Kahneman and Tversky 1983, 297): What explains that, given a background story, people judge that it is more probable that Linda is a bank teller and a feminist than that Linda is a bank teller? Following research in psychology, Fitelson rejects the idea that subjects might be comparing two exclusive, "contrastive" propositions, namely that Linda is a bank teller and not a feminist vs. that Linda is a bank teller and a feminist (80-81). Rather, subjects are confusing two notions of confirmation (as firmness vs. as increase of firmness). Fitelson's article is a bit more technical than the other contributions and it is also not so directly related to contrastivism (see the brief remarks on contrastivism in sec.2). It would have been nice to see an additional contribution on contrastive views of evidence and justification (as these notions are mainly used in epistemology).[3]

Perhaps the most iconoclastic contribution to this anthology is Martijn Blaauw's "Contrastive Belief". To my knowledge, Blaauw is the only author so far who has (in some detail) defended contrastivism about belief, that is, the claim that "belief" refers to a ternary relation between a subject, a proposition and a contrast set of propositions (with S believes that p, rather than q as the explication of S believes that p).[4] Blaauw identifies contrastive belief with comparative confidence: "Belief-III: S believes that p means that S is more confident that p than that Q" (93).[5] However, mere quantitative comparisons of degrees of confidence or belief (92) are not contrastivist in any interesting sense; the partial beliefs themselves are non-contrastive. But perhaps Blaauw rather wants to take belief as irreducibly comparative. However, then it is not really clear what it means to say that S believes that p rather than q. Apart from that, there is a threat of an "inflation of beliefs": I believe that Palin will win the next election rather than Nader, and I believe that Colbert will win the next election rather than Palin, and so on.[6] How can a comparative version of contrastivism explain that believing amounts to settling for a view against all alternatives and being ready to act on it, given appropriate circumstances?[7]

Apart from all that, what would count as the content of a subject's belief, what as its truth conditions? It is hard to make sense of the idea that S's belief that p, rather than q, is true just in case p rather than q. How could facts or truth itself be contrastive? Blaauw, however, doesn't see a problem here (95-96). If, on the other hand, the truth conditions for contrastive beliefs are the truth conditions of the target proposition (p; but cf. 93-94), then the belief that p, rather than q, would have the same truth conditions as the belief that p, rather than (for different q and r). This seems odd. Blaauw replies that it shouldn't since the conjecture that p, for instance, can share its truth-conditions with the belief that p. Right, but the problem here is one about content, not attitude type. So, how can different belief attributions involving different contrast propositions share the same truth conditions for the target belief? There seems to be a dilemma here because it is also not obvious how they couldn't, given identity of the target belief. Perhaps it would help to say more about the relation between the truth conditions of beliefs and the truth conditions of the corresponding belief attributions. Finally, consider, again, a case where a subject S believes that p, rather than q, while also believing that q, rather than r. According to the idea of non-contrastive truth conditions, the first belief is true iff p and the second iff q. However, these (one being the contrast for the other) cannot both be true.[8] On the other hand, the two beliefs do not seem mutually incompatible in any way. How is that possible?[9]

"Contrastive Knowledge" by Adam Morton, one of the main defenders of contrastivism about "knowledge", starts with the relation of tracking. It has counterfactual aspects: If I track your moving to the kitchen, then I would have noticed that you were in the living room had you gone there instead. Tracking is also contrastive: If I track your moving to the kitchen, then I notice that you've moved to the kitchen rather than to the living room even if I couldn't tell whether you're in the kitchen or in the adjacent small storage room. Morton argues (sec.1, 2) that the contrastivity of tracking suggests the contrastivity of knowledge though more could be said about the relation between knowledge and tracking and how the first inherits contrastivity from the second. Morton makes a parallel point about evidence. Its contrastivity suggests the contrastivity of knowledge, too (106-108). Again, it would be good to hear more about this connection between knowledge and evidence and about how contrastivity is transferrred from one to the other.

Morton ends (sec.5) with the problem of "arbitrary contrasts": Doesn't contrastivism allow for abominations like "Shakespeare knew that London was in England rather than 2 + 2 = 4" or "Shakespeare knew that London was in England rather than on Alpha Centauri"? However, as Morton points out, the first type of claim is ruled out by the fact that the contrast proposition has to be false -- and this is because the target proposition is true (111-112). The second type of claim is ruled out by the plausible constraint that the subject must have the concepts constituting the contrast proposition (112). What remains are claims like "Shakespeare did not know that London was in England rather than being in the English sphere of influence or being a British crown dependency" (112). What is missing here is "systematicity" of the "space" of contrast propositions (112). But what does "systematicity" mean here if it is not just another word for lack of arbitrariness?

Morton somewhat surprisingly states at the beginning of his contribution: "The version [of contrastivism] being defended here is fairly mild in that there is no suggestion that we cannot think in terms of a simpler not explicitly contrastive relation 'a knows that p'" (101). Does Morton want to suggest that contrastivism is just one of many different and equally correct ways of representing knowledge? If yes, why? Or does he mean to weaken his claims in a different way? Finally, one might wonder about the scope of knowledge contrastivism. It seems most plausible for cases of perceptual knowledge. But what about, say, mathematical knowledge? I know that 2 + 3 = 5 but what is the contrast set here? The set of all false mathematical propositions? Or the proposition that 2 + 3 ≠ 5? Such moves would drain the contrastivist claim of interesting content. It seems that if contrastivism about knowledge is plausible, then it is plausible for some forms of knowledge but not for all.

Justin Snedegar's "Contrastive Semantics for Deontic Modals" offers some very neat arguments for contrastivism about deontic modals like ought (sec.1), must (sec.2) and may (sec.3). Snedegar points out that contrastivism can solve some important puzzles but he is careful enough not to claim that other theories can't (130, fn.3). The puzzle about Professor Procrastinate concerns a situation where we are inclined to say that Procrastinate ought to accept an invitation to review a certain book and write that review but where we are also inclined to say (because we know that Procrastinate will probably not write the review, even given acceptance of the invitation) that Procrastinate ought not accept the invitation to review. The contrastivist way out says that the first claim is true if interpreted as relative to one contrast set {accept and write, accept and not write, not accept} while the second claim is relative to another contrast set {accept, not accept}(118).[10] Hence, there is no real tension between the two claims. Similar manœuvres work for sets of prima facie plausible but apparently mutually incompatible sets of claims like "Smith ought to whip his slaves more gently", "Smith ought to stop whipping his slaves" and "Smith ought to free his slaves". The Good Samaritan puzzle (given that obligation is closed under entailment, the obligation to help an injured stranger entails that there ought to be an injured stranger and that one helps them) as well Ross' paradox (given that "ought" is closed under entailment, the obligation to mail this letter entails that one ought to mail this letter or burn it) are also amenable to this kind of analysis.

Snedegar makes analogous points about must. The case of may is different because at least the first two puzzles don't work in this case. However, they work in the case of may not (in the sense of it is not the case that . . . may . . . ). Snedegar holds that if may not is contrastive so is may. He briefly mentions alternative views like conditional analyses of such modals (130-131, fn.15); despite the lack of space one would be curious to hear why the author does not go for such an alternative. Finally, the last two puzzles rely on a principle of closure of obligation under entailment that is not obviously true (even if I ought to return the book to the library I don't have an obligation to bring it about that there is a library). Why not turn the examples against this principle?

In his "Free Contrastivism" Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, one of the main defenders of contrastivism, argues with characteristic clarity and cogency for a contrastivist view of freedom.[11] Sinnott-Armstrong works with a distinction between freedom from certain things and freedom to do certain things. It is controversial how basic this distinction is; one can argue that the same fact can be correctly described in each of these two ways. A young person who fails to go to College because of lack of funding is not free from financial barriers to higher education; alternatively, we can also say that she is not free to go to College. Be that as it may, the main point here is that claims about freedom-from are relative to contrast classes of possible constraints: causation, external constraint, internal compulsion, ignorance, coercion, prohibition and excuse. A person who is free (or not free) from one constraint might be not free (or free) from another constraint. Philosophical arguments like classic ones for the incompatibility of determinism and responsibility (137) are based on equivocation over such contrast sets (141).

Sinnott-Armstrong makes similar claims about freedom to do things (sec.3). One might wonder, though, whether the distinction between different kinds of constraints suggests that "freedom" is ambiguous rather than contrastive. Furthermore, one can also doubt that incompatibilist arguments like, e.g., Peter van Inwagen's consequence argument (1983), can be construed as equivocating over contrast sets. Finally, much of contrastivist freedom-to is relatively trivial: A prisoner is free to bang his head against the left wall rather than the right wall but is not free to leave his cell. Can contrastivism explain why certain freedoms-to are much more valuable than others? Does contrastivism still have important things to say if we focus on the kinds of freedom worth fussing about?

Julia Driver's "Luck and Fortune in Moral Evaluation" addresses the problem of moral luck: How can we hold agents responsible for consequences of their actions beyond their control and also hold on to the principle that responsibility requires control? Driver favors objective consequentialism or "externalism" according to which the consequences our actions in fact have determined the truth-value of our judgments about responsibility. Suppose this is correct: Isn't this a rejection rather than a solution of the problem of moral luck? Driver proposes a contrastivist notion of luck. Someone who has won 1 Million in a lottery is lucky to have won rather than not won; but the person might still be unlucky to have won the lottery rather than have qualified to inherit 10 Million from her grandfather on the condition of owning less than 1 Million before the inheritance (160). This is plausible but does this kind of analysis solve the problem of luck? Hardly, it seems, because that problem arises when we judge someone as suffering from good or bad luck and still hold them responsible. Apart from all this, it would also be nice to find out a bit more about the details of luck contrastivism here.

Overall, the individual contributions to this anthology should be very interesting to those working on or with the relevant forms of contrastivism, to those who work on contrastivism about some G and wonder how contrastivism about some F might work, and finally to a more general readership who wants to find out what contrastivism is and what one can do with it. The general topic is certainly important and worth the attention. It will be interesting to see what further developments and applications (in aesthetics? Practical reasoning?) contrastivists will propose and to see more about how contrastivism compares with contrasting, alternative views.


Cappelen, Herman and Lepore, Ernie 2005, Insensitive Semantics. A Defense of Semantic Minimalism and Speech Act Pluralism, Oxford: Blackwell.

Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter 2006, Moral Skepticisms, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Tversky, Amos and Kahneman, Daniel 1983, Extensional versus Intuitive Reasoning: The Conjunction Fallacy in Probability Judgment, Psychological Review 90, 293-315.

Van Inwagen, Peter 1983, An Essay on Free Will, Oxford: Clarendon.


[1]Snedegar briefly mentions contextualism (117-118), Sinnott-Armstrong has made it clear in other publications that he is a non-contextualist contrastivist, Driver leaves the question open (159-160 and fn.6) as does Blaauw (94).

[2]One could discuss the binding test for covert variables more (see, e.g., Cappelen & Lepore 2005, ch.6). Schaffer is quite brief on other semantic alternatives (58-59).

[3]On this see two pages in Morton's contribution to this volume (106-108) and also, e.g., Sinnott-Armstrong 2006, ch.5.

[4]Blaauw begins with a brief presentation of cases in favor of belief contrastivism. However, one can doubt that the cases really support contrastivism. Also, it is not obvious that the phenomena are semantic rather than pragmatic.

[5]"Q" refers to the set of contrasting propositions. Given that "rather than" only takes on propositions (see the word "that" before "Q") and that sets of propositions are not propositions themselves, it is not clear what Blaauw has in mind here. Does "S believes that p" mean that S is more confident that p than that (q1 v q2 v . . . qn) (where the latter is a disjunction of all the propositions in the contrast set)? Or should we read Belief III as implicitly quantified: For all q in Q: S is more confident that p than that q? (but see fn.7 below).

[6]In contrast, there is no such inflation for contrastive knowledge because knowledge is factive.

[7]To be sure, there could be a proposition p such that for no other proposition q is it true that the subject believes q rather than p. One could then reply to the problem above by claiming that the subject is "really" committed only to this "privileged proposition". However, this seems to amount to giving up contrastivism.

[8]I suppose that Blaauw holds that target propositions and contrast propositions cannot both be true; otherwise contrastivism would be a much less interesting doctrine.

[9]Blaauw also claims that belief contrastivism can respond to Cartesian scepticism. However, Blaauw's solution only replicates the typical response of knowledge contrastivism (which does not entail belief contrastivism).

[10]It is not quite clear in what sense exactly these two contrast sets differ, given at least prima facie equivalence.

[11]It is also worth mentioning that his sec.1 gives a very good introduction to and overview over contrastivism.