Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event)

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Martin Heidegger, Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event), Richard Rojcewicz and Daniela Vallega-Neu (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2012, 433pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253001139.

Reviewed by Richard Polt, Xavier University


Composed in 1936-38 and published posthumously in 1989, Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis)[1] is the first in a series of private manuscripts that serve as incubators for Heidegger's later thought. In these texts he returns obsessively to certain leitmotifs and works on them from various angles -- criticizing traditional and conventional casts of thought, trying out formulations, and developing new vocabulary. In this way, he hopes to prepare for a radically new kind of thinking.[2]

This new thought is supposed to inaugurate "the other beginning," a counterpart to the Greek "first beginning" that has sustained the philosophical tradition so far. The first beginning is dominated by a series of metaphysical answers to the guiding question Was ist das Seiende? or "What are beings?" (p. 60 of the new translation, henceforth CP2). Heidegger's new question is, Wie west das Seyn? or "How does beyng occur essentially?" (CP2, 8). His reply is that "beyng essentially occurs as the event of grounding the 'there' or, in short, as the event" (CP2, 195, cf. 144).

The interpretive difficulties already explode. What does Heidegger mean by the obsolete spelling Seyn? What does it mean to speak of essence verbally? What is the "there," and in what sense does it get "grounded" in das Ereignis, translated here as "the event"? Obviously, pat definitions and simple answers will not do, since Heidegger is trying to lay out a whole new landscape of thought, but presumably he would not want us simply to recite his formulas, either. Secondary literature on the Beiträge attempts in various ways to strike a balance between repeating Heidegger's text and getting some interpretive purchase on it.[3]

The first English translation of the book, by Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly, was published by Indiana in 1999: Contributions to Philosophy (From Enowning)(henceforth CP1). For Emad and Maly, translators must be as venturesome as the text they are translating; they have not just the right but the responsibility to make bold choices in interpreting that text. The title of their version illustrates this approach. While the expression Beiträge zur Philosophie is an empty, generic label, Heidegger's parenthesized subtitle tries to cast out into a new realm. The preposition von can simply mean "about," but Heidegger denies that he is objectifying EreignisEreignis is in charge, so to speak -- hence Emad and Maly's "from."[4] As for the sense of das Ereignis, it would normally mean "the event," but Heidegger plays on the word's similarity to eigen (own, proper) so that it comes to mean something like "event of appropriation" (a common solution in translations of late Heidegger). Emad and Maly introduce "enowning" because they find "appropriation" too domineering (CP1, xxi) and "event" supposedly falls short of the required richness of meaning (CP1, xx-xxi). In order to create a complex of words in English that echoes Heidegger's language, Emad and Maly go on to coin a variety of en- words as counterparts to vocabulary that begins with er- in German: enthinking, enswaying, enhinting, and so on.

In many quarters, the Emad and Maly translation was received poorly.[5] The translators have mounted a defense of their approach, and of the word "enowning" in particular.[6] But even if one accepts their general philosophy of translation and this neologism, their version is problematic on other levels. The translation too often plays fast and loose with the grammar of Heidegger's German, obscures its meaning, is inconsistent, or is painfully awkward. Its style is a strange idiom where definite articles are often missing and the prose is riddled with archaic, legalistic, and contrived jargon: "charming-moving-unto," "inabiding," "hitherto" and "heretofore" misused as adjectives, and much more. Heidegger's idiolect is often experimental and sometimes takes the form of incomplete sentences, but it does not feel as precious and stilted as Emad and Maly's version.

Apparently recognizing the problems with the first translation, Indiana University Press has taken the unusual step of publishing a second translation just a few years after the first. The new translators are Daniela Vallega-Neu, a native speaker of German who has published books in German and English on the Beiträge, and Richard Rojcewicz, who is an experienced translator and co-translator of several lecture courses by Heidegger, including the closely related Basic Questions of Philosophy: Selected "Problems" of "Logic" (1937-38). Rojcewicz and Vallega-Neu provide German-English and English-German glossaries that quickly reveal their approach to translation: they generally favor simple, common words and allow the distinctively Heideggerian meaning to emerge from the usage of these words, rather than trying to pack it into a neologism. They have not "imposed on Heidegger's terminology the extraordinary sense which the ordinary words do eventually assume" (CP2, 15). The two-page translators' introduction does not refer explicitly to Emad and Maly, and does not directly address any of the arguments that Emad and Maly make in their own thirty-page (!) introduction, but the contrast is deliberate and obvious. Rojcewicz and Vallega-Neu's choice of the word "event" for Ereignis is emblematic; they ignore Emad and Maly's objection to the word, and simply let its sense be determined by how it is deployed in the text. The philosophical interpretation is left primarily to the reader.[7]

A few examples will illustrate the differences in vocabulary between the translations (BP=Beiträge zur Philosophie, CP1=Emad and Maly, CP2= Rojcewicz and Vallega-Neu).

BP: Seyn

CP1: be-ing

CP2: beyng

Comment: CP1's "be-ing" nicely highlights the verbality of the English word, thus suggesting (perhaps contrary to the translators' intent) that Seyn is, in some sense, an event. But this is an interpretive move, whereas CP2 simply imitates Heidegger's orthographic gesture and in that sense is less of an imposition. Seyn is an older spelling of Sein, still common in the early 19th century, which Heidegger may have been inspired to use by his study of Hölderlin. "Beyng," likewise, is an old spelling of "being." Unfortunately, since it has not been used in English for some 400 years, it looks quite jarring, but one can make the case that it is the best solution.

BP: das Seiende

CP1: a being

CP2: beings

Comment: The CP2 solution is standard, even though it pluralizes the German, which more literally means "that which is." CP1's "a being" sounds as if it means some particular but indeterminate entity.

BP: Ab-grund

CP1: ab-ground

CP2: abyssal ground

Comment: ab- is not a prefix that can be added at will to any English word; readers of CP1 have to mentally substitute something like the phrase from CP2 every time they read "ab-ground." (Unfortunately, CP2's "a-byssal" for abgründig tries again to make English jump through hoops.)

BP: Erschrecken

CP1: startled dismay

CP2: shock

Comment: CP1 makes this powerful emotion sound rather mild and genteel.

BP: Wesen

CP1: essential sway, what is ownmost

CP2: essence

Comment: Emad and Maly's proposals are interesting takes on the matter at hand. But if Heidegger thought that the word Wesen could receive new meanings, distinct from the traditional essentia, by being used in new contexts, why should we be any more pessimistic about the English "essence"? (For the verb wesen, CP2 uses "essentially occur"; this is an effective way to verbalize the noun.)

But how does the vocabulary get deployed in actual translation? Here are a handful of samples, beginning with Heidegger's three-line epigraph.

BP, xvii: Hier wird das in langer Zögerung / Verhaltene andeutend festgehalten / als Richtscheit einer Ausgestaltung.

CP1: What was held back in prolonged hesitation / Is here held fast, hinting, / As the "level" used for giving it shape.

CP2: What was held back in long hesitation / Is herewith made fast in an indicative way / As the straightedge of a configuration.

Comment: CP2 gets off to an inauspicious start with this awkward and obscure second line. I would choose the first and third lines from CP2 and the second line from CP1. If one doesn't mind rhyming, one could even render the second line as "is here held fast in intimation."

BP, 21: Die Stimmung ist die Versprühung der Erzitterung des Seyns als Ereignis im Da-sein.

CP1: Attunement is the spraying forth of the enquivering of be-ing as enowning in Da-sein.

CP2: Disposition is the diffusion of the trembling of beyng as event in Da-sein.

Comment: This sentence makes for a good example of CP1's easily satirizable enmania. CP2 is not immediately intelligible, but neither is Heidegger.

BP, 244: Sie [die Zerklüftung] ist die in sich bleibende Entfaltung der Innigkeit des Seyns selbst, sofern wir es als die Verweigerung und Umweigerung "erfahren."

CP1: The cleavage is the unfolding unto itself of the intimacy of be-ing itself, insofar as we "experience" it as refusal and turning-in-refusal.

CP2: The fissure is the self-contained unfolding of the intimacy of beyng itself, to the extent that we "experience" beyng as refusal and as the encompassing refusal.

Comment: The idea of adopting the term "cleavage" could occur only to translators who have lost their feel for everyday English. CP1's "unto itself" also does a less satisfactory job of capturing in sich bleibende, most literally "remaining in itself." When it comes to Heidegger's neologism Umweigerung, both translations have had to venture an interpretation.

BP, 249: Der Streit des Seyns gegen das Seiende aber ist dies Sichverbergen der Verhaltenheit einer ursprünglichen Zugehörigkeit.

CP1: The strife of be-ing against a being, however, is this self-sheltering of reservedness of an originary belongingness.

CP2: The strife of beyng against beings, however, is this self-concealment of the restraint of an originary belonging.

Comment: Aside from the issue mentioned above of how to translate das Seiende, this sentence illustrates CP1's tendency to translate verbergen (concealing) as if it were bergen (sheltering). "Sheltering" is indeed an important theme in the text, and Heidegger does mean to play on the connection between bergen and verbergen, but they are not the same word. Emad and Maly say that they will translate verbergen as "sheltering-concealing" (CP1, xxxii), but exceptions such as this one make it impossible for the English-speaking reader to be confident about what is in the German text.

BP, 385: Raum ist die berückende Ab-gründung des Umhalts.

CP1: Space is rendering ab-ground that charms-moves unto the encircling hold.

CP2: Space is the captivating and abyssal grounding of the embrace.

Comment: This is one of the very challenging formulas found in the important section 242 on "time-space." The reader is likely to find CP1's "rendering ab-ground" considerably more baffling than "abyssal grounding."

In general, where CP1 introduces a strange or misleading turn of phrase, CP2 is usually sober and consistent, and is easily recognizable to a reader familiar with the original. Despite the occasional lapse,[8] which one can find in any translation, the new Contributions to Philosophy is an impressive achievement. The vast majority of passages are no more opaque than the original, most of the translators' choices are very defensible, and the helpful appendices include German, Greek, and Latin glossaries as well as a bibliography of other writings by Heidegger to which he refers in this text. Above all, Rojcewicz and Vallega-Neu's more modest understanding of their responsibilities is a refreshing contrast to the first translation. Defenders of Emad and Maly will point to Heidegger's own bold and unconventional translations of Greek. But Heidegger intends his strongly interpretive translations for an audience that is already familiar with the Greek originals and their conventional renderings. In contrast, translators of Heidegger's books into English have the humbler task of providing a reliable approximation of the German for those who cannot read the original on its own. The job certainly requires care, time, and philosophical understanding, but the translator should try to avoid imposing an interpretation through contrivances and constructions that are not there in the German.

The translating is done. Let the reading begin.

[1] Martin Heidegger, Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis), Gesamtausgabe vol. 65, ed. Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1989). Henceforth BP.

[2] There is truth in Simon Blackburn’s jibe that, in the Contributions, “The orchestra is only tuning up”: “Enquivering,” The New Republic, October 30, 2000. But one should not underestimate the importance of such “tuning up” in philosophy.

[3] The main studies in English are Charles Scott et al. (eds.), A Companion to Heidegger’s “Contributions to Philosophy” (Indiana, 2001); Daniela Vallega-Neu,Heidegger’s “Contributions to Philosophy”: An Introduction (Indiana, 2003); Richard Polt, The Emergency of Being: On Heidegger’s “Contributions to Philosophy”(Cornell, 2006); Jason Powell, Heidegger’s “Contributions to Philosophy”: Life and the Last God (Continuum, 2007); and Parvis Emad, On the Way to Heidegger’s “Contributions to Philosophy” (Wisconsin, 2007).

[4] In their translations of the particular sentence in which Heidegger explains his subtitle (BP, 3), both English versions render von neither as “from” nor as “of,” but as “by” (CP1, 3; CP2, 5).

[5] See e.g. Theodore Kisiel, “Recent Heidegger Translations and their German Originals: A Grassroots Archival Perspective,” Continental Philosophy Review 38 (2006), 263-9.

[6] See Emad, On the Way, Introduction; Kenneth Maly, Heidegger’s Possibility: Language, Emergence—Saying Be-ing (University of Toronto Press, 2008), Appendix 2.

[7] The hyphenated Er-eignis is rendered in CP2 as “appropriating event,” and sich ereignen is “eventuate.” On the sense in which Ereignis should be considered an “event,” see Polt, The Emergency of Being, 72-87.

[8] The pseudoword “fortuitiveness” appears on CP2, 9, and the “absconding [Flucht] of the gods” (e.g. CP2, 24) makes it sound as if the dei absconditi are on the lam.