Controversies and the Metaphysics of Mind

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Yaron M. Senderowicz, Controversies and the Metaphysics of Mind, John Benjamins Publishing Company, 2010, 235pp., $158.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789027218889.

Reviewed by Richard Brown, LaGuardia College, CUNY


This book appears as the eighth installment of the series Controversies, which is edited by Marcelo Dascal at Tel Aviv University. The series has as its stated goal publishing "studies in the theory of controversy, … studies in the history of controversy forms and their evolution, case studies of particular or current controversies, … and other controversy focused books". Senderowicz is a Kantian scholar, having also written The Coherence of Kant's Transcendental Idealism and several papers interpreting Kant. Both of these themes are evident in Controversies and the Metaphysics of Mind. The book offers a decidedly neo-Kantian interpretation of the role that controversies play in metaphysical theorizing and applies this interpretation to two recent debates in the metaphysics of mind. The first is the debate about physicalism and the second is the debate about personal identity. The issues that are addressed include the relation of metaphysics to science and whether or not metaphysics deals with a distinctive subject matter or uses a distinctive method. This puts the book amongst the growing number of works in metametaphysics.

The book has an introduction followed by three parts; each part consists of three chapters. Senderowicz's aim is to give an account of the role of controversies in metaphysics that follows Kant in emphasizing the role of antinomies. In the first part this Kantian framework is elaborated and qualified. In the second part the framework is applied to the debate over the knowledge argument, and in the third and final part of the book the framework is applied to the debate over personal identity. In what follows I will give a brief overview of the framework and how it applies to the debate over the knowledge argument. I will have to leave discussion of the issues surrounding personal identity to the reader.

After the introduction Senderowicz lays out his neo-Kantian interpretation of the role of antinomies and controversies in metaphysics. Central to this is his idea that metaphysics and empirical science are united in a complex relationship. It is only when we have both that we get a complete explanation of any given phenomena. Though these two are united in giving us a complete explanation, each has its own method and justification. The method and justification of the empirical sciences is well known and Senderowicz focus on metaphysics. He argues that the only kind of justification that we can have in metaphysics is that of internal coherence. As such the only kind of evidence that we can give are thought experiments that aim to show that there is a more internally coherent alternative to some position. These are what Senderowicz calls controversial relevant alternatives. The clarification of positions, the introduction of novel distinctions and the establishment of new controversial relevant alternatives constitute progress for metaphysics.

In the second chapter he introduces two different kinds of argumentative strategies that are central to his project, which he labels type-A and type-B. Type-A argumentative strategies aim to "reveal internal difficulties taken by the arguer to be unexplainable by the position X she is attacking," while type-B arguments point to some fact that both sides acknowledge needs to be explained and argues that the opponent’s view is unable to explain it (p. 54). Type-B arguments are designed to shift the burden of proof to the other side. An antinomy on this modified Kantian view is a debate where both sides are employing type-B strategies. Since both are using arguments that challenge some fact stated in a common language, the burden of proof is on both sides at once, resulting in what Senderowicz labels a pragmatic antinomy. Senderowicz aims to apply this theory, showing that the debate surrounding the knowledge argument and personal identity fit this pattern. Before he turns to that, though, Senderowicz spends some time discussing the role of intuitions in philosophy in chapter three.

He begins with a question. What are we to make of the fact that intuitions seem to be our only evidence for metaphysical theories yet we find that many experts have conflicting intuitions? He begins by explicating Frank Jackson on the role of intuitions. Intuitions reveal one's theory, whether held explicitly or implicitly. To the extent that our intuitions overlap we share the same theory, and to the extent they overlap with the folk we share the folk theory. Intuitions on this view are judgments and differ from beliefs. Intuitions are judgments generated by contemplating ideal cases. In the knowledge argument we imagine a scientist who knows all of the physical facts, in the zombie case we imagine a completed physical science, etc. Since the ideal cases extrapolate from the actual world, they are linked to or grounded in the actual world; this explains why intuitions are able to play the role that they do. They give us information about the actual world because the ideal cases we contemplate begin with the actual world. Senderowicz distinguishes between propositional imagination and objectual imagination. One has to do with determining whether a given sentence would or would not be true in an imagined case while the other has to do with "picturing" the object. These two forms of imagination interact. As he says, "imagination is guided by concepts, but it may also inform our beliefs regarding the meaning of words" (p. 71). This lets Senderowicz claim that metaphysics is the a priori layer of science. Science and metaphysics, in true Kantian fashion, each have a role to play in giving us a complete account of how the world is.

Further, Senderowicz argues that metaphysics mixes matters of fact and logical matters in a unique way that gives it a distinctive subject matter and methodology (p. 73). He also distinguishes between conceivability-at-a-time and timeless conceivability. Since intuitions are sometimes fallible we can mistakenly think that something is timelessly conceivable when it is merely conceivable-at-a-time. When we have a pragmatic antinomy we are faced with a situation where equally plausible intuitions point in opposite directions. How are we to resolve this dispute? By what method will we know which intuition is right? Senderowicz assumes that empirical results won't tell us. He also argues that conducting new thought experiments won't usually solve the problem. Instead he suggests "a rational resolution of such problems requires a unique type of creative act that goes beyond the state of the ordinary conceptual framework at a given time" (p. 65). The point of this methodology is to transcend the antinomy in such a way that we get new controversial relevant alternatives and this is what constitutes progress in metaphysics. Since Senderowicz assumes that intuitions reveal our theoretical commitments this amounts to the claim that we get new theoretical alternatives.

In the second part of the book Senderowicz turns to a detailed examination of the literature surrounding the knowledge argument, arguing that it fits the pattern of a pragmatic antinomy. It begins with Jackson giving the knowledge argument in his paper "Epiphenopmenal Qualia". Paul Churchland responds in the type-B manner by positing a case where Mary knows all of the non-physical 'ectoplasmic' facts. It still seems like she wouldn't know what it is like to see red without having seen it. Jackson responds in the vein that lectures in black and white will not let one know all there is to know about qualia. Both responses seem intuitively right, so we conclude that we have a pragmatic antinomy on our hands. This is distinguished from the manner in which Daniel Dennett responded to the knowledge argument. Whereas Churchland takes the argument as pointing the way to something useful (a new set of distinctions), Dennett sees the whole enterprise as misguided and harmful. This illustrates Senderowicz's distinction between type-A and type-B kinds of arguments. This leads him to a discussion of the paradox of phenomenal consciousness. On the one hand, the knowledge argument seems to suggest that "the qualitative features of our life involve a unique type of information [and so] … cannot be physical properties of objects" (p. 107). On the other hand, we have the intuition that phenomenal conscious has to be causally efficacious. Out of this clash Senderowicz traces the rise of the phenomenal concepts strategy and ensuing controversies, Michael Tye's PANIC theory and ensuing controversies, the two-dimensional response and ensuing controversies, and Jackson's conversion to physicalism. This is all in chapter five of part two.

In chapter six Senderowicz turns to tracing the debate surrounding the explanatory gap from Joseph Levine to Jackson and David Chalmers’ response, to Ned Block and Robert Stalnaker's response to that response, to Chalmers and Jackson's response to that response. This series of controversies, new creative acts introducing novel distinctions which then lead to more controversies, just is what constitutes progress in metaphysics for Senderowicz.

As detailed as Senderowicz's account is, it is interesting that he focuses on the knowledge argument and completely neglects the zombie argument. At first glance we seem to find a similar pattern in the zombie/shombie antinomy. The zombie world is a world where there are physical duplicates of me that lack consciousness. The shombie world is a world where there are physical duplicates of me that have consciousness and yet are mere physical duplicates. Many authors, including Keith Frankish, Kati Balog, and myself, have pointed out that shombies seem conceivable in just the same sense as zombies, though we have disagreed about what this shows. Some think that it shows that there is a gap between what is conceivable and what is possible (Balog holds this view) while others think that it shows that only one of these is really ideally conceivable (what Senderowicz would call timeless conceivability, presumably) and the other is merely prima facie conceivable, or conceivable-at-a-time t where t is now. Shombies are at least conceivable-at-this-point-in-time for the same reason that zombies seem conceivable now and that is just that there is nothing in our concept of phenomenal properties that indicates that they are non-physical. Put otherwise, there is nothing obviously contradictory with phenomenal properties being physical properties. When we add to this a physicalist-friendly theory of phenomenal consciousness like first-order or higher-order representation theories, we also get what Chalmers would call positive conceivability. Yet it is not clear that this standoff fits either the type-A or type-B mold. Senderowicz is clear that he does not take himself to have given an exhaustive analysis of controversies so this may not be a big deal. However, I found myself wishing that he had spent more time pointing out how the various arguments and responses fit his molds rather than just being told that they did.

There is much in Senderowicz's discussion that I find valuable. His development of a neo-Kantian metametaphysics is a welcome and interesting view, and I hope that people working in this area will pay attention to and discuss it, though I found myself not being convinced fully by the argument that internal coherence is the only way to judge metaphysical views. This is just one instance of a general lack of engagement with any of the recent work in this area. Senderowicz goes into great detail examining canonical texts from the late 1990's to all but the last few years, but does not try to connect his metametaphysical discussion to the most recent work done in metametaphysics, or even try to connect his discussion to that in some of his canonical texts. For instance, though there is ample discussion of the debate between Chalmers and Block on two-dimensional semantics, there is no discussion of how this view relates to Senderowicz's own. To be sure, they are not exactly theories of the same thing, but two-dimensionalism does have certain consequences for one's metametaphysical views. It would have been nice to see some discussion of this. This lack is especially ironic for an author who exhorts the controversy-based approach to philosophy. On a minor note, the systematic overuse of italics throughout the text and the dense wide-ranging discussion do not make this an easy read. But overall Senderowicz presents an interesting metametaphysical view that is worth defending and worthy of the attention of those who work in this area.