Conventionalism: From Poincaré to Quine

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Yemima Ben-Menahem, Conventionalism: From Poincaré to Quine, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 340pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521826195.

Reviewed by William Demopoulos, Talbot College, University of Western Ontario


Ben-Menahem's study of conventionalism begins with Poincaré and Duhem, continues through Hilbert and Carnap, and concludes with discussions of Quine, Wittgenstein and Putnam. Along the way there are numerous illuminating remarks about the foundations of mathematics and the philosophy of relativity theory. The book is a pleasure to read and would make an excellent basis for discussion in a graduate seminar. Ben-Menahem states her theses boldly, and argues for them with skill. The writing is at once direct and accessible. Philosophers of science will find much to learn from her book, and some things with which to take issue. Of particular interest are the discussions of Poincaré and Hilbert, and Poincaré and Duhem; they form the focal points of this review.

Ben-Menahem's reconstruction of Poincaré's and Hilbert's views is determined largely, though not wholly, by her response to Quine's characterization of conventionalism as a doctrine of "truth by convention." Ben-Menahem argues that neither Poincaré nor Hilbert could have held such a view because they both identified the truth of a mathematical theory with its consistency. Since they perceived that consistency must be proved rather than stipulated, and since this task is usually mathematically non-trivial, they would have had to have held that mathematical theories are consistent by convention. But they evidently held no such view of consistency, and therefore could not have held any such view of truth. It is an interesting question, to which I will return, just how successful a reconstruction of Poincaré's conventionalism can be recovered from Ben-Menahem's response to Quine's representation of conventionalism as a doctrine of truth by convention; or from a discussion which, like Ben-Menahem's, seeks to explain Poincaré's doctrine by placing it in the context of his views on pure mathematics and Hilbert's conception of axioms as implicit definitions. But first, let us consider how it fares as the basis for an account of Hilbert's and Poincaré's views of pure mathematical theories.

As for Hilbert, his emphasis on proofs of consistency and his appreciation of the difficulty in obtaining them can hardly be questioned. But Ben-Menahem's account obscures the fact that for Hilbert the identification of the truth of a pure mathematical theory with its consistency is not meant to explain a non-conventionalist conception of the truth of such theories but to argue that the classical Euclidean conception, according to which mathematical theories express truths, is simply mistaken. For Hilbert, the presumed truth of the theories of pure mathematics explains neither their interest nor their acceptability. I am unsure whether Ben-Menahem has considered the possibility of such a reconstruction of Hilbert; it is, in any case, in tension with the account that emerges when Hilbert's views are tailored to fit her response to Quine. Given the equation of truth with consistency, Ben-Menahem's reconstruction is supposed to show that truth cannot be stipulated but must be proved.

The practice of demonstrating consistency by means of what would later be termed modeling leaves no doubt that the basic intuition underlying the thesis that consistency is a sufficient condition for truth is that if the (sets of) axioms are consistent, an interpretation that makes them true will eventually be found… . [T]hat consistency yields truth does not entail sanctioning truth by convention. As long as consistency and satisfaction are considered non-conventional, as they generally are, truth is not a matter of convention. By the same token, the method of implicit definition and the concomitant construal of axioms as definitions are not to be associated with a prerogative to stipulate truth. (159-160)

Notice that throughout this passage Ben-Menahem means truth in a model rather than truth. But it's implausible that anyone who understood the technical notion of truth in a model would seriously entertain the idea that it is something that might be stipulated rather than proved by a mathematical argument. Hence, to learn that Hilbert did not maintain this is neither surprising nor particularly illuminating for our understanding of his view. As I remarked earlier, there is a well-known and much more straightforward interpretation of Hilbert, one that tells us a good deal more about his view of truth -- not truth in a model -- in connection with pure mathematical theories. On this reading, a theory of pure mathematics is not true by convention simply because it is not true at all. Hilbert's point is that in the sense in which it is usually intended, 'true' is not properly applied to the theories of pure mathematics. When Hilbert argues that in mathematics truth and existence mean the same as consistency, this must be understood in the context of a broader dialectical argument against the tradition, represented perhaps most famously among his contemporaries by Frege: Call such theories true if you wish, but recognize that this can only mean that they are consistent. It's clearly this straightforward reading that Einstein had in mind[1] when, explicitly referring to Hilbert, he said of geometry that insofar as it is certain it does not refer to reality, and insofar as it refers to reality it is not certain, by which he clearly meant that the peculiar epistemic status of pure mathematics comes at the expense of its being true -- at the expense of its "referring to reality."

With at least one exception, Poincaré regarded the axioms of pure mathematical theories as disguised definitions, meaning by this something close to the position advanced by Hilbert in his Foundations of Geometry, and defended by him in his correspondence with Frege. At the same time, Poincaré placed great emphasis on the importance of proofs of the consistency of such "definitions." The single most important exception is the Principle of Complete Induction. On Poincaré's view, Induction cannot have the status of a definition because it is presupposed by those proofs of consistency which proceed by interpreting one theory in another, and arguing inductively, from the absence of the derivability of a contradiction in the one theory, to the absence of a contradiction among the theorems of the other. Since Induction is also evidently not a principle of logic, it is not analytic. And indeed, one of Poincaré's chief complaints against the logicists was that by viewing Induction as definitional of the concept of natural number,[2] they prevented themselves from giving a correct account of its methodological significance -- of its constitutive role in our conceptual framework, where it is not only a principle which figures prominently in arithmetical reasoning, but where it is also essential for the evaluation of mathematical theories. Since Induction is presupposed in the evaluation of mathematical theories, it cannot be represented as a mere definition, the consequences of which we might explore, as we would the "axioms" of other mathematical theories. Poincaré's views on theories of pure mathematics, some of which he thought of as definitional, are not without interest. But it's doubtful that these views have anything to do with the conventionalist doctrines that we typically associate with him. Their point is not so much that the axioms of pure mathematical theories are conventions, as that Induction is not a convention but a principle that must be recognized as synthetic a priori. I think that Ben-Menahem may well recognize this, but then her decision to place her discussion of Poincaré's conventionalism in the context of his views on the philosophy of pure mathematics is more than a little confusing. I believe that there is a connection between conventionalism and the representation of theories as implicit definitions, but it has been missed by Ben-Menahem. I will address this issue at the very end of the review.

Returning to the concept of truth by convention, Ben-Menahem takes issue with Quine for having fostered the view that conventionalism is committed to the notion of making something true by a stipulation. But it is relatively easy to see that a conventionalist need not put things this way. It is much more natural for a conventionalist to argue that, of the propositions of our total theory which we regard as true, some are conventions, while others are genuine truths. What is striking and tendentious about such a thesis is the idea that a proposition hitherto taken to express a truth about reality is in fact a mere convention. On such an understanding of conventionalism there is no need of the notion of making something true by convention. This is almost certainly Poincaré's position in the case of applied or physical geometry, and Ben-Menahem is clearly right to emphasize that if conventionalism is understood as the doctrine that some propositions are made true by convention, then Poincaré was no conventionalist. Notice however that it is possible to make this observation concerning Poincaré's conventionalism about the geometry of space without even mentioning the equation of consistency with truth. So although Ben-Menahem is correct to separate truth by convention from the historically interesting case of Poincaré's conventionalism, the appeal to the equation of truth with consistency introduces an irrelevant and therefore misleading consideration into to the exposition of the most important of his conventionalist theses -- the conventionality of geometry.

Another strand of Ben-Menahem's discussion of Poincaré emerges from her comparison of his views with those of Duhem. This strand arises by reflection on the claim that Poincaré is committed to the empirical equivalence of different geometries. Ben-Menahem maintains that Poincaré held that alternative geometries sustain a stronger relation than empirical equivalence, since they are relatively interpretable in one another. Her discussion of Poincaré's notion of equivalence emerges only gradually from an argument that spans many pages. Here is a brief synopsis -- as far as possible in Ben-Menahem's own words -- of how she arrives at her understanding of the relevant notion of equivalence.

Of Duhem, Ben-Menahem first observes that his

… conception of science does not arise from considerations specific to geometry and the relation between Euclidian and non-Euclidean geometry, but points to the philosophical significance of underdetermination and empirical equivalence in science in general. Does Poincaré, then, merely develop a particular instance of Duhemian conventionalism[? O]r is there a distinct, and far more conclusive conventionalist argument from geometry as [Science and Hypothesis] plainly seeks to demonstrate? (42)

A major task of Ben-Menahem's book is to show that there is strong reason to believe that the correct answer to the second question is "Yes." Can we perhaps say that Poincaré has

… demonstrated a stronger equivalence between geometries, namely their logical equivalence, or at least their theoretical equivalence -- equivalence anchored in a well-established theoretical principle such as the principle of relativity? (64)

No, because

[o]nce we hit upon such general principles … the theories in question can be deemed variants of the same theory rather than instances of genuine underdetermination… . Poincaré, by identifying an equivalence stronger than mere empirical equivalence yet weaker than obvious theoretical equivalence, succeeded in [avoiding this consequence]. (78-79)

What then is the equivalence Poincaré has uncovered? Ben-Menahem begins with the suggestion that it is established directly by the relative consistency proofs; in other words that

… intertranslatability establishes complete equivalence between theories, not just empirical equivalence, for when theories are intertranslatable, each theorem of one theory has its counterpart in the other, whereas when only empirically equivalent, they must imply the same observational sentences, but otherwise may differ in their theoretical implications. (41)

But she argues that the situation is more subtle than this, since

[i]t might be the case that physics interferes with the translation in a way that compromises [their empirical] equivalence. It might be the case, that is, that while each theorem (axiom) of one geometry is translatable into a theorem of the other, no such simple connection holds between the corresponding physical laws. (56)

Ben-Menahem believes that Poincaré addresses this concern by arguing (in chapter IV of Science and Hypothesis)

… not merely that it is in principle possible to come up with empirically equivalent descriptions, but [by defending] the much stronger claim that there is a constructive method for actually producing such equivalent descriptions. The argument, it should be noted, applies only to geometry, not to science in general. (19)

When we take the geometric primitives to be without interpretation save for their association with the terms for physical objects, events and processes, there is an interesting parallel between the notion of observational equivalence which arises in the positivist tradition's general theory of theories, and the relation which Poincaré believed to obtain between alternative geometries. This parallel shows that there is a much closer connection between Poincaré's conventionalism and the positivist analysis of scientific theories in general than Ben-Menahem is willing to allow. To see this, let us recall what the explication of sameness of factual content in terms of observational equivalence comes to for a positivist reconstruction like Carnap's.

Relative to a formalization of the language of science in which there is a sharp separation between observational and theoretical vocabulary, two theories T and T' are factually equivalent if every sentence whose vocabulary is exclusively observational is a consequence of T iff it is a consequence of T'. On Carnap's reconstruction of theories, the fundamental distinction is between theoretical and observational terms. But Poincaré's reconstruction of the status of geometry focuses on the distinction between geometrical and physical vocabulary. Poincaré accords geometrical primitives the status Carnap assigns theoretical terms, and this means that his view of the sentences of geometry corresponds to Carnap's view of sentences whose vocabulary is exclusively theoretical. By contrast, those sentences of our total theory of geometry plus physics that describe physical objects, events and processes have the status that Carnap assigns to observation statements: like observation statements they are fully interpreted.

Since on Carnap's reconstruction of the language of science, theoretical terms are treated essentially as variables, Carnap can maintain that the Ramsey sentence of a theory gives a suitable reconstruction of its factual content. Similarly for Poincaré, geometrical primitives are treated like variables, and like variables, they are not restricted to a fixed interpretation. Just as in Carnap's reconstruction the interpretation of the observational vocabulary does not fix the interpretation of the theoretical vocabulary, so also for Poincaré, the interpretation of the vocabulary of physics does not fix the interpretation of the geometrical primitives: the interpretation of 'path of a light ray' may be fully determined, but that of 'geodesic of space-time' is not.

Both Poincaré's account of the theory of space and Carnap's reconstruction of theories attempt to capture the "structural" character of certain assertions by representing them as purely formal claims. For Poincaré, this has the consequence that the relative interpretability of two geometries is a sufficient basis for their equivalence; hence, the relative interpretability of one geometry in another shows the choice between them to be a matter of convenience. For Carnap the representation of theories as purely formal claims is the source of his identification of their factual content with their observational content.

It follows from classical results of Craig[3] regarding the model theory of first order theories with disjoint vocabularies that under very general conditions, a model of the sentences of the theory in one vocabulary can always be expanded to a model of the sentences of the theory formulated in the other vocabulary. Poincaré's constructions of inner models of Lobatschewskian geometry in models of Euclidean geometry have a mathematical interest beyond these general metalogical results; they also have a special methodological interest because of what they show regarding the intuitability of non-Euclidean geometry: not only is it consistent, but it is consistent relative to Euclidean geometry by a ruler and compass construction. But on the matter of relevance to the conventionality of geometry and the factual content of theories, all that matters is that Carnap's and Poincaré's views depend only on the freedom with which the theoretical and geometrical vocabulary is interpretable in (respectively) a model of the true observation sentences and a model of the true physical-object sentences of the theories of interest.

The parallel between Carnap and Poincaré is easily missed if one focuses on Carnap's explicit statement of what constitutes a theory's conventional component. For Carnap this is represented, not by the Ramsey sentence, but by what is now known as the Carnap sentence of the theory -- the conditional whose antecedent is the theory's Ramsey sentence and whose consequent is the theory (as reconstructed in a language whose vocabulary is divided between observational and theoretical terms). The Carnap sentence is naturally regarded as expressing a convention, since it has no non-tautological observational consequences and satisfies a reasonable non-creativity condition. My point is that for Carnap purely theoretical statements, though not conventional in the sense of these desiderata, are like Poincaré's representation of the axioms of geometry in the sense that their truth in one or another model of the true observation sentences can virtually always be secured. But if this is right, then one cannot argue, as Ben-Menahem does, for a difference in principle between Poincaré's conventionalism about geometry and what is true, on Carnap's conception, of the theoretical:

[Given] the empirical nature of science[,] … the basic laws of nature must be confirmed rather than stipulated. In science we cannot be content with the assurance that our theory, if consistent, is bound to have some model, or infinitely many models; rather, we need the theory to be true (or approximately true) in the actual world … (172)

The thrust of Poincaré's argument about geometry was that the alleged conflict between geometries is indeed only apparent, for the conflicting sets of axioms are satisfied by different entities. [It is of crucial importance] that Poincaré's argument pivots on equivalence: a physical theory framed in terms of Euclidean geometry can be translated into a theory framed in terms of Lobatschewskian geometry. (174-175)

One has either to take the whole package, or none of it.

A basic contribution of Poincaré's conventionalism and the postivists' conception of the theoretical was their recognition of the necessity of interpretive principles for posing well-defined questions of theory choice. Their accounts of how such principles are arrived at and what epistemic status they and the theories they concern enjoy was fraught with many difficulties. The recent book by DiSalle,[4] also published in 2006 by Cambridge University Press, is a reliable guide to conventionalism from this perspective. As I indicated at the very beginning of this review, Ben-Menahem's book is particularly valuable for the discussion it is sure to evoke regarding both the historical and systematic connections that comprise the conventionalist tradition in the philosophy of science. However, her discussion is compromised by her decision to shape the exposition of conventionalism by her response to Quine's notion of truth by convention. The discussion of Hilbert on the truth of axioms is the first casualty of this decision. The nature of Poincaré's conventionalism is the second. Since the bearing of Poincaré's views on pure mathematics on his view of geometry -- which is the proper locus of his conventionalism -- is never made clear, Ben-Menahem's promise to explain the role of Hilbert's axiomatic method in Poincaré's conventionalism is never kept. Finally, the extended discussion of Poincaré on the equivalence of alternative geometries fails to crisply characterize the intended notion. As a consequence Ben-Menahem misses the basic affinity between Poincaré's conventionalism about geometry and the positivist conception of theories; the irony of this omission is that the role of implicit definition really is central to the understanding of this latter development.


Support from the Social Sciences and Humanities Research Council of Canada is gratefully acknowledged. Many of the subjects dealt with in this review are taken up more fully in my contribution to a forthcoming Number of Synthese in honor of William Craig; the special issue is being assembled under the guest editorship of Paolo Mancosu.

[1] In his often-quoted January 27, 1921 address to the Prussian Academy of Sciences, "Geometry and Experience."

[2] Although not implicitly definitional, in the sense we associate with Hilbert.

[3] Associated with his Interpolation Theorem; I have discussed this at some length in "Carnap on the Rational Reconstruction of Scientific Theories," The Cambridge Companion to Carnap, Richard Creath and Michael Friedman (eds) Cambridge University Press, 2007, pp. 248-272.

[4] Robert DiSalle, Understanding Space-Time: The Philosophical Development of Physics from Newton to Einstein, Cambridge University Press, 2006.