Conversation and Self-Sufficiency in Plato

Placeholder book cover

A. G. Long, Conversation and Self-Sufficiency in Plato, Oxford University Press, 2013, 184pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199695355.

Reviewed by Frisbee C. C. Sheffield, Christ's College, Cambridge


The works of Plato suggest that he was committed to the dialogue form. Much work has been written on the use of dialogue form in Plato, arguing (amongst other things) that one of its functions is to avoid dogmatic theorizing and to engage the reader to participate actively in the philosophical conversation depicted. Plato, it is often argued, regarded conversation as central for participants in philosophy, and that is ultimately why Plato remained committed to the dialogue form: philosophy is essentially dialogical. Though this view is ubiquitous in the literature on this topic, the value of philosophical conversation itself is often not brought under scrutiny. It is one of the many virtues of Long's thoughtful study that he tackles this issue. Why does philosophy require conversation for Plato? What kind of conversation is beneficial for philosophical activity? Do all kinds of philosophical activity require conversation of some form, or only some kinds of philosophical practice? If so, what are these? It is the aim of this book to answer these and related questions.

Long begins to explore the claim that philosophy is essentially dialogical with some important distinctions. First, he clarifies the nature of 'philosophy' at issue here: does the claim that philosophy is dialogical refer to inquiry and, if so, what stage of inquiry? Does it also, or by contrast, refer to disseminating the results of inquiry? Or is philosophy essentially dialogical when it involves getting people interested in philosophy (p. 3)? 'Plato may suppose that all these activities require conversation, but that they need conversation for importantly different reasons' (p. 3). Second, Long explores what it might mean to claim that philosophy is 'dialogical or conversational'. He argues that since thought is characterized as dialogical in some dialogues, we cannot assume that all dialogue is interpersonal; it may be intrapersonal. The contrast between these two kinds of dialogues becomes a central theme of the book. Long argues that internal dialogue became 'a viable context for philosophical inquiry' and this has an important bearing on the question of whether an individual can be intellectually self-sufficient (p. 5). Long argues that Plato's position on conversation changed. Initially, Socrates' interlocutors, particularly those who claim moral expertise, 'offer Socrates a perspective against which to test and confirm his own theories' (p. 6), but Plato came to allow an individual to provide herself with opposition in an internal dialogue. In light of this, Long considers 'how and to what extent is the value of conversation rethought?' (p. 6).

One of the best features of this book was the analysis of different types of conversation in the dialogues. Post-Long it should no longer be acceptable to write about conversation in the dialogues without specifying exactly the kind of conversation to which one is referring. This comes to the fore in the first chapter on the Phaedrus, considered to be a main source for the view that philosophy is both (a) dialogical and (b) interpersonal. As Long argues persuasively, the discussion of the value of conversation at the end of the Phaedrus is concerned first and foremost with teaching, for rhetoric is a kind of leading of the soul, practiced by one with knowledge, for the purposes of teaching and learning (275e5, 276c3-4). As a result, anything said about conversation in this context is concerned with the value of conversation for teaching, not inquiry; on the latter, according to Long, the Phaedrus has little to say (pp. 10-26).

Long turns next to the Protagoras and argues that it explores the benefits of conversation for inquiry. There is a subtle analysis of the discrepancy between normative claims about the value of conversation and Socrates' actual procedure in the dialogue (pp. 28-34). This is followed by careful interpretation of the nature of the agreement Socrates requires (p. 35). Long considers the importance of commitment to the conversation (p. 36), which is required because conversation must provide 'evidence of the interlocutor's agreement' (p. 39). Long then considers why such agreement is confirmatory for Socrates given that one can reach agreement without reaching the truth (p. 40). Long argues that it adds to the persuasive force of his arguments when Socrates addresses himself to beliefs of radically opposed interlocutors whose agreement promises to provide strong confirmation. Commenting on the Gorgias, Long argues that:

In showing how fundamentally his opinions differ from Socrates' opinions, Callicles shows how well-qualified he is to put Socrates' opinions to the test and, should he be brought to 'agreement', to confirm Socrates' opinions. Making such an opponent concede the truth of his views provides Socrates with the strongest confirmation of those views. (p. 43)

But then Long raises a puzzle: if agreement with strongly opposing views is the salient factor, why do interlocutors need to be present? 'Vocalizing the agreement seems unnecessary' (p. 45). Long argues that Plato came to see the force of this question. Whilst conversation may be the best method for teaching philosophy, it is not clear that inquiry requires interpersonal dialogue.

Internal dialogue comes to the fore in the Hippias Major (p. 47), a work whose authenticity has been doubted by Kahn (1985), but which Long argues adds significantly to Plato's account of thought as internal dialogue in the Theaetetus and the Sophist. In the Hippias Major we are shown that, and why, internal dialogue is sometimes preferable. Long begins by surveying some difficulties with intrapersonal dialogue from the Gorgias, where intrapersonal dialogue is a last resort when constructive interpersonal dialogue fails. Plato shows how difficult it is for Socrates to represent a Calliclean position (p. 50). It seems that one cannot internalize the sort of opposition that such characters can provide themselves, though Glaucon and Adeimantus argue against their beliefs when they praise the benefits of injustice in the Republic. In the Hippias Major, though, intrapersonal dialogue is seen in a more positive light, as something that results not simply from a failure in interpersonal dialogue (as in the Gorgias); intrapersonal dialogue is described as a philosophical habit of Socrates and it is seen as part of his demand for intellectual accountability (p. 57).

The consolatory project of the Phaedo reinforces Plato's commitment to the possibility of an internalized dialectic, though Socrates' friends take little comfort from the loss of their conversational partner and friend (p. 64). The Phaedo both highlights the benefits of conversation as Socrates reflects on conversations with his friends and looks forward to conversations in the afterlife, and also shows the legitimate possibility of doing without it (argued by means of an analysis of Socrates' autobiography (96bf.)). The Phaedo reflects, for Long, a 'compromise position' that reflects the ambivalence in the text about Socrates' departure (p. 86).

The Republic is shown to address the issue of how Socrates can examine beliefs when their advocate is unavailable for questioning, as well as considering why we now have conversation with allies, not opponents (as in the Phaedo). Long argues that Book I returns to the problem Callicles presented, namely how one deals with an interlocutor who withdraws from the debate (Rep. 327c10-12). The solution is to replace Thrasymachus with more co-operative spokesmen (p. 92). The lack of prominence given to internal dialogue in the Republic does not show that Plato no longer considers it a legitimate tool for the philosopher; rather, it has to do with the importance of persuasion in the Republic (pp. 88-9). Plato is concerned to explore the use of question and answer as a means of persuasion, and that is why the conversation of this dialogue takes a specific form, where the interlocutors can seize control of the conversation when Socrates' arguments fail to meet their objections (p. 99). Co-operative interlocutors have the additional benefit of allowing Socrates to develop explanations for his arguments more thoroughly (p. 105).

Chapter 6 explores the notion of internal dialogue in the Theaetetus and Sophist and, in particular, the bold claim that 'to think is to question oneself' (p. 109). Long explores the kind of mental events under consideration here, and argues that mental activity that results in judgment is at issue in these dialogues (pp. 112-114). Long considers whether there is evidence in these dialogues that the soul by itself can consider different points of view, and whether interpersonal exchanges are necessary, or advantageous, for critical scrutiny of the beliefs of oneself and others (pp. 126-129). Socrates fruitfully examines both his own explanations of falsehood in the Theaetetus, and those of Protagoras, thus demonstrating that the examination need not be interpersonal. Similarly in the Sophist, Long argues that one and the same person both speaks for the Sophist and shows how to counter the Sophist's objection (p. 130). Long goes on to consider whether fairness in conversation is connected to interpersonality (p. 133) and argues that it is not. The critique of Protagoras in the Theaetetus 'explicitly considers the fairness of criticizing Protagoras in his absence' (p. 132). Socrates himself corrects any perceived unfairness, and aims for what Long terms 'maximal authenticity' and 'maximal charity' when he considers the most plausible interpretation of Protagoras' thesis (p. 135). 'The fact that Socrates corrects his own critique of Protagoras suggests that a critique undertaken internally is possible and could be no less fair' (p. 137), though this may still not be enough to persuade the proponent. The upshot is that the Theaetetus and the Sophist show that a philosopher can without external aid stage a fair debate with his opponents: 'internal dialogue is now a viable solution to the dialectical problem presented by Callicles in the Gorgias' (p. 138). For Long, what ultimately motivates Plato to take a more positive view of internal dialogue is not just the Callicles problem (where an interlocutor is temperamentally unfit for discussion), but also the problem of conversing with types like the flux theorists of the Theaetetus who seem incapable of dialectic (p. 138).

The final chapter on the Laws argues that the Athenian needs non-Athenian cultures and viewpoints, but not necessarily non-Athenian interlocutors. This chapter does not fit so neatly into the range of questions explored so far, with the first two sections focusing on differences between the political inquiry in the Republic and the Laws. Section III turns more specifically to conversation in the Laws, showings its distinctive features, such as the Athenian's dominance throughout the discussion, despite the encouragement to learn from foreigners (p. 156). The central message is that the Laws shows the value of familiarity with a range of cultural perspectives, but also shows that 'these perspectives can cohabit in a single well-travelled individual' (p. 160). The point of the dialogue form here is no longer to show the benefits of conversation, but rather to demonstrate how empirical research from a range of sources furthers political inquiry.

The book lacks a conclusion, but its overall thesis seems to be the following. Though philosophy is dialogical for Plato, it is not necessarily, or by that same token, interpersonal, because in later dialogues Plato considers the opportunities for going it alone. While dialogue remains crucial for teaching and persuasion, what is important for inquiry is some kind of opposition to provide a test for one's inquiries, or taking account of different perspectives (as in the Laws), but not interpersonal dialogue, which may be problematic with radically opposed interlocutors. As far as issues of dialogue form are concerned, the upshot seems to be that whilst this form may exemplify the dialogical nature of philosophical thinking, we should now have a more nuanced understanding of what this involves in light of Long's distinction between the kinds of conversation on offer in the dialogues and the different reasons for their deployment. There is no single rationale for conversation in Plato's works, any more than there is any single rationale for writing in dialogue form (developed in Long 2008).

Also of interest was material about the differences between intrapersonal and interpersonal dialogue. For example, there is no insincere flattery in the former (p. 61), competitiveness is thwarted, if not abolished (p. 62), and there are fewer 'constricting imperatives', such as concern for the other. But Long is careful to argue that conversation with others is 'not demoted to second class status' (p. 63), for conversation with certain opponents offers a kind of critical scrutiny that is not possible in self-criticism. Here I wondered about the value of conversation for self-knowledge and whether a conclusion might have touched on some of the ethical questions mentioned in the introduction (p. 7). For though Long considers whether it is possible to be fair to one's opponent in an internal dialogue, there is less time spent on considering whether one can be fair to oneself. Certain dialogues suggest that 'maximal authenticity', for example, might require another party, particularly a like-minded other, to act as a mirror to one's own thoughts (e.g., Alcibiades 133b7-10; Phdr. 253b). If we allow ourselves the Aristotelian assumption that one cannot study one's own thoughts as easily as one can those of another (MM ii 15 1215a7-26 used by Cooper (1999) to explore NE ix 9. 1169b18-1170a), then part of the purpose of conversation with (at least) like-minded friends might be to come to a kind of intellectual self-awareness that is not possible alone. The relationship between conversation and self-knowledge is raised in a wide range of works (Apology 23b, Chrm. 167a1-7, Tht. 210b11-c4, cf. Phdr. 253b and Alcibiades 133b7-10) and it is not clear how this goal fares in light of the shift Long studies towards intrapersonal dialogue (even if some of the other-regarding virtues of philosophical conversation can be maintained in those contexts concerned with teaching and persuasion).

A different question might be raised about the scope of the dialogical nature of Plato's philosophy. If it is dialogical (either inter- or intra-personally), then how far does this take one along a philosophical inquiry? How much philosophical thought is dialogical? It would be expecting too much of this study to answer such questions too. And without a clear sense of the many uses to which Plato does put conversation in the dialogues, such further questions may not be up for consideration at all. This is a thought provoking study, with much attention to detail and careful textual analysis, that will be of use to anyone interested in dialogue form, philosophical method, and intellectual self-sufficiency in Plato.


Kahn, C., (1985) 'The Beautiful and the Genuine: A Discussion of Paul Woodruff, Plato, Hippias Major', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 3: 261-87.

Long, A., (2008) 'Plato's Dialogues and a Common Rationale for Dialogue Form' in (ed.) Goldhill, S., The End of Dialogue in Antiquity, Cambridge University Press, 45-59.

Cooper, J., (1999), 'Aristotle on the Forms of Friendship', in his Reason and Emotion: Essays on Ancient Moral Psychology and Ethical Theory, Princeton University Press, 312-36.