Conversations on Art and Aesthetics

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Hans Maes, Conversations on Art and Aesthetics, Oxford University Press, 2017, 336 pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199686100.

Reviewed by Andrew Huddleston, Birkbeck College, University of London


For better or for worse, contemporary philosophy of art, like most every philosophical sub-discipline, is dominated by the academic journal article and the scholarly monograph as the main media of publication. This book marks an interesting change. Following and adapting the format of a similar volume relating to ethics, this book offers ten discussions, led by Hans Maes, with distinguished figures in the field.

Although the dialogue form has a long philosophical history, many of the most famous examples in the canon are not actually conversations, in any full-blooded sense. They are scripted exchanges written by a single author. And, however philosophically insightful, they are often poor examples of even a fictional version of the back-and-forth of a conversation that is genuinely mutual -- so dominant is the perspective of one philosophical voice, as in many of the Socratic dialogues. We also, increasingly, have the format of the intellectual interview where questions are a prompt for further expatiation and elaboration by the interviewee. The present book sometimes operates in that interview mold, and informatively so. But at its best, it lives up to its title of Conversations, where Maes and his interlocutor get a good philosophical discussion going and where both parties seem to be learning from each other.

Maes's questions and comments are exceptionally well-informed, and he draws on a rich stock of artistic examples, whether to illustrate his points or to provide a challenging case to think about. Although there are a few standard questions that Maes will repeat across different figures being interviewed, in general the shape of the discussion was adjusted to fit the interests of the philosophers he was conversing with. (These were Noël Carroll, Gregory Currie, Arthur Danto, Cynthia Freeland, Paul Guyer, Carolyn Korsmeyer, Jerrold Levinson, Jenefer Robinson, Roger Scruton, and Kendall Walton.) While a few of the discussions were via email, most, Maes notes in his introduction, were conducted in person and taped. Maes has transcribed these recordings and edited them considerably so that they read with concision and focus. But he has nonetheless kept a bit of the fluidity of informal speech. The conversations are divided into useful sub-sections, and good guidance is given as to relevant further reading at the end of each discussion.

In the usual format of journal article and scholarly monograph, personality is often effaced, in the name of rigorous Wissenschaft. Even the dust-jacket author photo on books is increasingly rare. While these interviews are mainly focused on the substance of philosophical theories, it was also interesting to get a sense of these philosophers' personal artistic tastes, and in some cases, their personal background -- for example, how they ended up in the field. This sense of personal connection was heightened through the cover portraits by Steve Pyke of Maes and his interviewees, which are reproduced in larger size as frontispieces of sorts to each interview. Many of these pictures were excellent. And thanks to the exchange with Cynthia Freeland on the topic on portraiture, one was prompted to think further about matters on this score, with reference to these fine examples of the genre.

I wondered, at times, about the intended audience for the volume. Sometimes, Maes's questions invited the discussants to summarize some aspect of their views. This could provide a useful introduction to those who are coming to these topics fresh, but it would, in most cases, be too elementary for those already familiar with the work of these philosophers. Nonetheless, there were occasional insights even for those more seasoned in philosophical aesthetics. This format allows philosophers to flag important clarifications about their views, to forestall misunderstandings, and the like. This I found particularly helpful in the discussion with Kendall Walton, where I picked up a couple things that I had misunderstood in Walton's published work (or, at least, had forgotten). And in the case of many of the other figures, it was instructive to see how they would explain their views, and their motivation for their views, in the short time allotted. Especially for philosophers, such as Jerrold Levinson, who writes primarily (one book excepted) articles rather than extended monographs, it was interesting to get a sense of the interconnection among the ideas in discrete pieces of work.

In a format such as this, much greater latitude is available for venturing large scale opinions -- programmatic views of a sort. It was, to my mind, welcome to get a fair bit of this.

But Maes would often press back in a useful way that kept these statements from getting too much in the mode of unsubstantiated assertion. In this way, these exchanges went considerably beyond summary, and made headway on some of the underlying philosophical issues (or at least flagged important ideas for further reflection). Maes showed strong philosophical judgment throughout, but managed to temper this well with an admirable objectivity and open-mindedness. One never got the sense, even with topics he has himself written about, that there was a particular 'party line' that he was eager to press.

In addition to introducing the thought of the figures discussed, the book also offers an overview of many central issues in contemporary Anglophone aesthetics -- topics of recurring debate, such as the definition of art, the nature of aesthetic experience, or the relevance of the artist's intention to appropriate interpretation. Maes usefully brings figures into juxtaposition on certain of these issues (for example, Guyer, Levinson, and Carroll on aesthetic experience.)

The discussions also provided a good venue for considering methodological issues in aesthetics -- for instance, the place of science (esp. psychology and cognitive science) in shedding light on philosophical questions. (This was an important theme in the conversations with Jenefer Robinson and with Gregory Currie, with a more skeptical note sounded by Roger Scruton.) So too the place of history in aesthetic theorizing came up several times, both the issue of the history of aesthetic theorizing itself (prominent in the conversation with Paul Guyer), and the issue of engagement with the history of various arts, and the ways in which both sorts of history are relevant to contemporary work. Moreover, there was useful reflection on the focus of scholarly attention in aesthetics, for example, why there has been relatively less attention devoted to dance, a topic on which Nöel Carroll had interesting things to say, or similarly on the role of gustatory taste (a theme in the discussion with Carolyn Korsmeyer).

Most interesting of all, to my mind, was the consideration of the methodology of contemporary aesthetics, and the role of large-scale theory-construction versus more local intervention in particular debates. Danto resists the label of "hedgehog" (72) -- a reference to Isaiah Berlin's hedgehog (who has one big idea), versus the fox (who has many different ideas) -- and surprisingly so, coming from the figure who might have seemed most aptly described this way, with Walton and Scruton perhaps close second. One leaves the volume happy that there are both foxes and hedgehogs in aesthetics, yet, given the rarity of hedgehogs relative to foxes, wondering whether there will be any emerging in the years to come, and hoping there will be.

Two final observations: First, all of Maes's interviews were with quite senior aestheticians. Apart from the late and considerably more senior Danto, the philosophers included here, I either know or would guess, completed their PhDs in the 1970s, perhaps give or take a few years. This is thus an interview of, essentially, a particular generation of thinkers. No doubt it was difficult to choose those interviewed, and there were surely space constraints. Maes, it seems to me, has made good selections. Still, I thought a greater cross-generational perspective would have been helpful. Relatively junior scholars may of course not yet have the breadth of publication and vision for this format to be apt. But those who in the next decade or so will be the senior figures in the field -- for example, those who did PhDs in the late 80s and early 90s, perhaps even into the late 90s and early 2000s -- would have been very welcome. We would, I think, have gotten a richer sense of where aesthetics is headed as a discipline if we broadened the cross section somewhat.

Likewise, Maes's focus is almost entirely on contemporary Anglo-American aesthetics. (Guyer, Danto, and Scruton have extensive engagement with themes or figures from the German tradition, but in approach, they are firmly Anglo-American.) As Maes notes in the introduction, analytic philosophy of art is his expertise, and that was good reason for staying on that turf. Nonetheless, I thought it might have been worthwhile to have a couple major figures in continental aesthetics brought into the dialogue. Judging by the questions Maes asked of those figures he interviewed, he is better positioned than many to ask informed, focused questions to figures working in the continental tradition, questions that could bring out this tradition's key themes and potential advantages, and usefully illuminate the stylistic and metholodogical differences between this approach and the Anglo-American approach, while asking probing follow-up questions that would not allow implausible positions to go unchallenged or obscurities to go unclarified.

But in choosing any set of discussants, one must of course make selections, and there are many competing considerations. There are a number of philosophical subfields where I would be interested in reading something similar, but again would welcome a greater cross-section of scholars. In any event, this is a fine book, and a worthwhile genre for publishers to explore further.