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Luce Irigaray, Conversations, Continuum, 2008, 188 pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847060365.

Reviewed by Alison Stone, Lancaster University



This book is a collection of ten interviews with Irigaray by scholars and readers of her work from the U.S., Canada, the U.K., and Norway. The interviews span the period from 1996 to the present. Some have been published before, but in scattered places, so it is helpful to have them assembled together.

Some interviews address specific topics: architecture, building and dwelling, with Andrea Wheeler; yoga, with Michael Stone; the later Merleau-Ponty, with Helen Fielding; education, with Michael Worton; and Irigaray’s re-interpretation of the Virgin Mary, with Laine Harrington and Margaret Miles. I found this a particularly interesting interview. Irigaray interprets Mary to have been a ‘virgin’ in the sense of having achieved integrity as a woman and autonomy with respect to her mother Anne; thus, she had a kind of spiritual perfection that enabled her to generate a divine child. Irigaray firmly rejects the interviewers’ reference to Mary as a symbol, insisting on the historical reality of her virginity and of the incarnation — although, evidently, her understanding of what these realities consist in departs considerably from theological tradition (pp. 87-88, 102).

The remaining interviews, which are with Stephen Pluhácek and Heidi Bostic, Elizabeth Grosz, Gillian Howie, Birgitte Midttun and Judith Still, range over Irigaray’s thought as a whole. They cover its overall development; key recent themes, particularly that of men’s and women’s different ‘relational identities’; and problems such as Irigaray’s ‘essentialism’ and her increasingly explicit privileging of sexual difference over other differences. Regarding this last topic, Irigaray clarifies that she considers sexual difference to be the most universal and basic difference because it is natural (although not exclusively natural). In addition, because different cultures are different ways of cultivating nature (see for example p. 54), they are therefore different ways of cultivating or failing to cultivate sexual difference. Ethnic differences thus are different modifications of sexual difference. Hence, Irigaray suggests, if we could learn to respect the sexually different other, then we could learn to respect people from different cultures to our own — since our differences are permutations of sexual difference (p. 29).

However, on the whole, these interviews are often less productive than they might have been. Irigaray tends to reply to questions about potential problems with or criticisms of her ideas by reiterating these ideas. Sometimes this is because she fears that her interviewers have misunderstood those ideas. At times she appears to feel misunderstood just because her interviewers characterize her ideas in terms different from her own. For example, Elizabeth Grosz says:

It is possible … to divide your work into three periods or phases: the first is largely occupied with the critique of psychoanalysis and with extricating the two sexes from confused conceptions that masculinize the female subject; the second could be described as a series of interventions into the history of philosophy to remind philosophers of their unspoken debts to women, the mother and to the female body; and the third … is directed to finding a way, socially, politically, ethically and amorously, to connect the two sexes (p. 123).

Irigaray replies:

I do not consider the trajectory of my work to be as you suggest. I would rather say that the first part … amounts to a criticism of the Western tradition as constructed by a single subjectivity, a masculine subjectivity … In the second part, I try to indicate mediations which permit a feminine subjectivity to emerge … , to affirm herself as autonomous and capable of a … culture of her own. The third part of my work is devoted to defining … the ways through which masculine subjectivity and feminine subjectivity could coexist (p. 124).

Irigaray does not seem to find in Grosz’s description an interesting alternative view of her trajectory which allows her to reconsider her own work in a new light. This typifies the way that Irigaray often seems more concerned to correct than to engage with her interlocutors, the title Conversations notwithstanding.

Sometimes linguistic and cultural differences underlie these failures of dialogue. When asked about essentialism by Gillian Howie, Irigaray replies that “the relations between the two subjects [masculine and feminine] are found from their different ways of relating to the self, to the other(s), to the world. They then exclude the existence of immutable values or essences which could be shared by all people” (p. 78). Then Howie asks, “It has been said that you advocated strategic essentialism … Would you agree … ?” Irigaray strongly disagrees, saying that she “search[es] for specific ways of cultivating a feminine identity. Could it be this task which is confused with essentialism by some people? It was realized in order to reach the possibility of being two” (pp. 78-79). In other words, Irigaray is saying here that she is not an essentialist because she seeks to create or cultivate a distinctive feminine identity, one not defined in relation to masculine identity but in its own terms, autonomously. This is not essentialist, because (Irigaray takes it here) to be an essentialist would be to believe in a set of universal, gender-neutral, human values. This doesn’t clarify, however, whether Irigaray is an essentialist in terms of feminist debates about essentialism, in which essentialism is understood to be the belief in universal properties, situations, or experiences common to all women, commonalities that are possibly rooted in female biology. To many feminists, Irigaray’s beliefs as expressed in this collection (and elsewhere) — that there are real natural differences between the sexes, that the sexes differ ontologically in their Being and being, and that the sexes have different ways of relating to others rooted in their different bodily forms — will sound essentialist. This in itself, however, reveals something: the fact that Irigaray herself denies (here and elsewhere) that she is an essentialist does not settle the issue, because she does not understand the term in the same way as most other feminists.

At various points in this book Irigaray helpfully clarifies or refines key concepts from her work. She says that she now prefers to talk of sexuate rather than sexual difference, because the former better conveys that men and women differ in their whole ways of being, their ‘relational identities’ — their ways of constructing relations of the self to itself, to others, and to the world. Another recurring theme is that sexuate difference is natural and ‘real’, although traditionally it has not been recognized; it is the ‘living real’ as distinct from ‘codified reality’, reality as we perceive it under the divisions made in it by the Western logos (p. 2, 116). Traditionally in the West, then, (if not elsewhere too) we have not had sexuate difference. The female way of being has long been repressed — or, perhaps better, ruled out of existence or foreclosed. Women have been defined and have come to experience themselves merely as the negative other of man.

Nevertheless, Irigaray is able to describe female sexuate being as having (at least) two aspects: (1) Female bodies have specific structures, processes and capacities — for gestating, bearing, and breast-feeding children. Given that these are lived and not exclusively biological bodies, women have a specific way of experiencing and inhabiting their bodies and of relating to others in terms of their bodies — a way of relating to others as other subjects (perhaps after the model of the fetus/baby as another subject). (2) Being born female involves having a specific relation to one’s maternal origin: as a baby and infant, one finds oneself to be in an immediate relation to a care-giver whose body is of the same sex as one’s own and with whom one shares the capacity to beget and nurture babies (see for instance p. 11). This leads girls to tend to relate to others in a specific way: as one subject to another like subject. In contrast, a baby boy finds himself immediately related to a mother from whom he must differentiate himself in order to assume his own identity as a male. There is a spontaneous tendency for boys to do this by separating themselves from relations and the body, and by re-defining the mother and women as objects that are inferior to male subjects — so that boys/men thus become inclined towards subject-object relations (p. 31). Females privilege intersubjectivity; males privilege subject-object dynamics.

One of Irigaray’s sources of evidence for this pattern is her research into typical sentence constructions used by eight-year-old school-children. The following is a rather demoralizing sample:

What types of utterances are produced by children … to the cue asking [them] to make a sentence with the words ‘with’, ‘together’, ‘to love’, ‘to share’ … ? The girls produce sentences [such] as ‘I talk with Marco’, ‘Marco and I have a child together’, ‘I am madly in love with Gian Paolo’ … The boys, for their part, make … ‘I hit the ball with the racket’, ‘I always play together with them’ (other boys, according to the context … ), ‘I share the computer with my mom’. (pp. 24-25).

Does the fact that Irigaray is able to describe the feminine, intersubjectively-oriented way of being mean that this way of being in fact exists, unaffected by the repressions effected by patriarchal tradition? Or is Irigaray evoking or announcing it as a future possibility that has yet to be created and which she wants to inspire us to create? She is pulled in opposing directions here. She wants to appeal to women’s experience, qualities and virtues as a source of criticism of patriarchy (in this respect her project is like those of other feminist thinkers such as Nancy Chodorow or Carol Gilligan). If, however, these qualities derive from women’s relational identity, and if that identity were in fact a product of patriarchy, then it would not provide a reliable standard of criticism. Plausibly, this identity is a product of patriarchy, of the gender division of labor whereby women and girls are expected to take the overwhelming responsibility for caring for others and for maintaining the fabric of interpersonal relationships. To avoid this conclusion, Irigaray is pushed towards seeing women’s relational identity as a source of value that exists externally to patriarchy, deriving not from patriarchal social norms but from female embodiment and from the female condition of being born a girl to a similarly female mother. Nevertheless, if this source of value indeed exists undamaged by patriarchy, patriarchal culture seems not to be so radically bad or destructive of women’s way of being after all, whereupon we lose the case for radical social transformation.

As I see it, with her conception of relational identity Irigaray aims to steer out of this dilemma. Although women’s — and men’s — relational identities arise out of their modes of embodiment and their relations to the maternal origin, to have a relational identity is to have a particular form of subjectivity, and subjectivity is open to being directed in various ways by culture. In a patriarchal culture, which is based on the male need for subject-object relations and on a concomitant privileging of men over women, women are led to channel their urge towards intersubjective relations towards men and to favour men over women (as is evident in the school-girls’ utterances). If we could transform this culture, then men’s spontaneous subject-object tendency could be channeled — cultivated — in a different and more benign direction. Women’s tendency to intersubjectivity can still be a source of challenge to patriarchal culture, a potential source of transformation, because, despite the distortions it has undergone, it remains an alternative to subject-object thinking.

By and large, these most recent ideas of Irigaray’s have yet to be taken on board or discussed extensively by contemporary feminists. They are not new to this collection of interviews, but the collection does help to clarify them. Moreover, it testifies to Irigaray’s prodigious ability to think creatively about a huge range of questions, and to offer a comprehensive and unique approach to the contemporary world.