Coping with Choices to Die

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C. G. Prado, Coping with Choices to Die, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 187pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521132480.

Reviewed by Felicia Cohn, University of California, Irvine, School of Medicine; Bioethics Director, Kaiser Permanente Orange County


C. G. Prado offers a philosophical treatise of the reactions of loved ones (referred to as "survivors") of persons who elect to die due to terminal illness (referred to as "electors"). He explores how the surviving family and friends deal with the ill person's decision to die, particularly with regard to the severed relationships that result. The attention to survivors in this book is unique, and justified, according to Prado, because the survivor role is distinctive. Survivors may be forced to deal with decisions of loved ones over which they have no control and by which they are greatly affected. With this focus, the book provides a helpful complement to the literature on decision making by the terminally ill, assisted suicide and euthanasia, and the grief process for survivors. Though not explicitly a sequel, this book does follow up on issues raised in Prado's 2008 book, Choosing to Die, in which he addressed the rationality of elective death.

Prado is clear in Chapter 1 that his work is philosophical, "an abstract investigation of how elective-death survivors must reason" about the elector's choice to die (p. 22). He repeatedly apologizes for offering such a philosophically dense discussion of what ultimately is an issue of perhaps the greatest practical import. However, he explains that his goal is to help survivors understand and reason about their loved ones' decisions to die. He aptly entitles this chapter, "Laying the Groundwork," and he seems to be referring to providing philosophical context for his subsequent argument. Perhaps unintentionally, he also reveals why this philosophical treatment is helpful:

One reason why survivors' reactions to electors' choices to die must be considered carefully is because feelings influencing those reactions sometimes are not readily identifiable by survivors or by those friends or professionals advising them. A particularly notable instance is when feelings present themselves as intuitions or instances of "just knowing": as understandings that, although unsubstantiated, nonetheless are taken as somehow objective. Survivors' emotional responses to electors' decisions too often present the feelings their emotions prompt as externally rather than internally generated, and hence as reliable bases for decisions and actions… . Misconstruals by survivors of their feelings as intuitions is not something that is usually considered (pp. 15-16).

Prado essentially is offering a formal analysis of the "gut" responses that both drive and interfere with the medical decision making process.

The helpful preface by Wesley Boston provides necessary background on various approaches to understanding emotions, including the philosophical, psychological, and neurobiological. Boston further unpacks the distinction, critical to Prado's analysis, between feelings as short-term affective states and emotions as long-term affective dispositions that define individuals and what they feel. Underlying these key concepts is one of unacknowledged importance, which further justifies the need for analytic treatment of this topic. This is the objectivity/subjectivity distinction, which is fundamental in clinical medical practice, the setting in which decisions about life extension and elective death most often occur. On Prado's analysis, feelings and cultural influences so influence objective decision making as to challenge current decision making standards in health care. Informed consent requires that individuals make deliberate, autonomous, and informed decisions about their medical treatments. The presumption -- or perhaps the goal -- is that these decisions are rational and understandable to others, but this is not always the case. Family and friends of a dying person often counter the individual's stated treatment preferences, either while the person retains decision making capacity or once he/she becomes incapacitated, based on objective claims to know what the patient would have wanted.

Studies in the medical and ethics literature, however, show that family members regularly make different choices for their loved ones than the loved ones would have made and that usually family will err on the side of more aggressive life-extending treatment than the patient would have wanted. These choices, rather than being selfish or disrespectful, may be due to a lack of awareness of the survivor's own biases, beliefs, and feelings. Conflicts may also arise when the involved health care professionals perceive these choices as emotional or subjective, and contrary to evidence-based or "objective" medical recommendations. The patient's or family's perspective may be questioned on this basis. Prado's analysis reframes this conflict, suggesting the need to examine internal and external motivations and confounding factors. At root, this sense of objectivity requires further exploration, not only for survivors but also for health care professionals.

In Chapter 2, Prado examines survivors' feelings about elective death, how those affective states influence their responses, and whether those feelings can be managed. He then takes up in Chapter 3 the role of culture, both iconic and coincidental, in electors' decisions and survivors' assessments of elective death. Through multicultural dialogue, he argues, survivors may gain better awareness of their beliefs and enhance their capacity for more objective evaluation. Clinical ethics consultations are often requested to address these very issues. Ethics consultations frequently take up the issue of a family member's insistence on extending the life of a patient who would prefer to die, either according to that person's explicit statement or extrapolation from values displayed previously. Extending Prado's analysis suggests that such conflicts may be inevitable. The solution, according to Prado, is not to deny these responses, but to manage them. Prado commends what clinical ethicists have long practiced: open, constructive, and ongoing processes of communication that give voice to all perspectives and values and include consideration of those personal and cultural beliefs about which the involved individuals might not even be aware.

In Chapter 4, Prado revisits and revises the criteria for rational elective death that have evolved through his two previous works, Choosing to Die and the earlier The Last Choice: Preemptive Suicide in Advanced Age (1998). Familiarity with those works, while not necessary, is beneficial. After reviewing the requirements for sound reasoning and recognition that death may be annihilation, he emphasizes the need to consider survivors' interests. His approach is one of compromise, in which electors are encouraged to suffer longer in tribute to their relationships with those who will survive them and for survivors to use that time to appreciate this sacrifice and come to accept the decision. It is an interesting suggestion and one certainly in keeping with the book's focus on survivors' coping abilities. However, it seems to presume that coping is primarily a function of a choice to die, without acknowledging that the real problem may be dealing with the implications of terminal illness itself. The choice to die may only occasion reflection on the reality of mortality, whether that is by election or the natural progression of disease. Decisions about the timing of elective death may well be a luxury. Embedded in this text is a reflection of a "meta-bias" in American society in which death is perceived as the ultimate enemy, something to delay as long as possible, and sometimes as something that modern medicine presents as if it is optional. Without a fundamental acceptance of death, not just as inevitable but in some way appropriate, the need to help survivors cope with even the most rational of electors' decisions will persist, a theme Prado addresses in the last chapter.

Prado acknowledges in Chapter 5two challenges to his criterion for rationality: the postmodern challenge to the universality of reason and the required recognition of death as annihilation. These emerge essentially as responses to critiques of his previous works and result in a further reformulation of his rationality criterion:

Self-killing is rational if autonomous, soundly reasoned, and adequately informed, and multicultural assessment determines it best serves one's interests while timed to least harm survivors (p. 115).

He recognizes that some may consider that he is stating the obvious, but this, he argues, highlights the value of philosophy. Constructive benefit derives from the analysis itself. In this he makes a simple yet profound statement that applies to his work as well as to the difficult dialogue required with survivors so that they may actually survive an elector's death.

Finally in Chapter 6, Prado discusses survivors' responses. He describes categories of responses, two appropriate and two inappropriate, each of which involves assessments of the elector's rational decision making. The only response to an inappropriate response, he notes, is further discussion. On this he expands in Chapter 7. He briefly describes the long history of philosophical interest in death and insightfully asks whether philosophy can help. It is at this point that Prado weaves considerations of human mortality into his analysis. Appropriate survivor response may ultimately require understanding or acceptance of the human condition or, as Prado puts it, "accepting finality," the mortality of first the self and then the other. Though Prado's argument is well constructed, he may have been better served by starting with the last chapter. Mortality, and human responses to it, will involve feelings that color decision making. Rational choice may be inhibited without an acceptance of human finitude. Further, perceptions of rational choice in the context of mortality will be affected by one's beliefs about afterlife, an issue Prado takes up in an appendix. The problem here is that what comes after death is a usually a matter of faith, to which rational argument is unlikely to apply.

On Prado's account, one's end-of-life decisions necessarily affect others, and therefore ideally one would integrate consideration of those effects into the decision making process. In addition to the complications of human relationships, reality further complicates this process and requires attention. The timing of elective death is framed by natural parameters. A terminally ill patient is, in fact, terminal. There may be some time to play with, but the hidden costs of taking that time to gain survivors' acceptance may include progress to intolerable suffering or loss of capacity for decision making in a surrender to the disease process or the limits of medicine. In addition, there are physical, emotional, and even financial realities that also affect decisions about (forgoing) medical treatment. Many people express concerns about becoming a burden to their families, even when their families claim to be willing to accept the burden. Decisions to live or to die may be motivated not by the impact on relationships but by these other factors. Survivors, likewise, experience conflict or ambivalence in considering electors' decisions. Sometimes understanding and acceptance can never be achieved or will be achieved without consideration of rational criteria.

Beyond the complicated reality emerge concerns about imposing requirements for rational decision making on such an emotionally fraught decision and response. Some of our most important decisions are rooted in emotion, feeling, or other non-rational considerations, the choice of whom to marry or to have a child, for example. While rational considerations may help support survivors, the resulting argument may be disingenuous, more rationalization than rationale.

Finally, a comment on the audience for this book is warranted. According to Prado, he writes for medical ethicists, current and future, and for those (likely all of us) who are or will find ourselves in the position of a survivor (p. 22). There is much of value for each of those groups. Prado notes that he revised his criteria for rational elective death extensively in response to critique from colleagues and health care professionals seeking something briefer and more practical (p. 70). Perhaps he might do the same with this analysis. This book has the potential to be an essential reference for clinical ethicists, patients, and their families and friends, but most are not trained in analytic philosophy. This is not the book to hand to the dying patient's spouse so that he might understand his wife's decision and better deal with his response. Clinical ethicists may draw on Prado's analysis in their daily work, but many of those ethicists are not philosophers by training. Those coming from backgrounds such as social work, psychology, or medicine may experience the same impatience with the complexity of Prado's text as health care professionals experienced with his rational elective death criteria. In Prado's defense, his purpose and method is analytic philosophy. Yet, a concrete interpretation is sorely needed by both patients/families and those health care professionals attempting to help them make or come to terms with one of the most difficult, and usually least desired, decisions an individual can face.