Cornel West and Philosophy

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Johnson, Clarence Shole, Cornel West and Philosophy, Routledge, 2003, 208pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415940745

Reviewed by Leonard Harris, Purdue University


Johnson argues that the philosophy of Cornel West, prophetic pragmatism, has an ethical basis of secular humanism. The classical themes of pragmatists, for example, a view of truth as constructed propositions and instrumental approaches to problem-solving are themes integral to West’s philosophy. The ’prophetic’ features of his pragmatism, like that of William James’ pragmatism, allow for religious faith as a reasonable choice and the use of faith as a source of inspiration. Johnson shows that West’s humanism is consistent throughout his career.

Although West’s earlier works argued in favor of a Marxist class analysis and his later works emphasize structural problems, the common interests of diverse identities such as lesbians, gays and racial categories, West sustains a commitment to universal human liberation. Johnson accounts for West’s views by tracing the history of his preoccupations, from his formative years in segregated Sacramento, California, reading Kierkegaard at thirteen, the role of the black church in his life, and his exposure to pragmatism at Harvard. Johnson has an account of West’s “Purpose in His Philosophy,” namely, giving voice to the spiritual afflictions of the powerless. His central vocation is “an ethic of love” as expressed in the Bible and he “envisions himself a modern day prophet” advocating on behalf of the wretched of the earth. West’s philosophy is thus defined according to Johnson by secular humanism, liberal Christianity, and prophetic pragmatism.

The core of black oppression for Johnson is the “systematic institutional exclusion of Blacks from the public domain in light of their blackness (which is deemed an aberrant on the society).” Consequently, Johnson rejects West’s preference for a class-based affirmative action public policy as a solution to black oppression because black oppression is race-based. Blacks are certainly oppressed by class and gender, but ’black oppression’ as a particular kind, for Johnson, is not addressed by class considerations but by how it is possible for blacks to be included by institutions and no longer seen as abject.

Johnson also takes issue with West’s criticism of the Harlem Renaissance. The Harlem Renaissance scholars that West criticizes, according to Johnson, are W.E.B. Du Bois, Alain Locke, James Weldon Johnson, George Schuyler and Richard Wright. In the 1920’s these authors and others in Alain Locke’s seminal anthology, The New Negro (1925), certainly portrayed blacks as a stable, dignified, and coherent community rather than oppressed as beleaguered workers, agrarian share croppers and minstrel men and women. In doing so, they tended to portray blacks as homogenous and racism as having a ubiquitous deleterious effect. These intellectuals, according to West, did what the white male power elite did - universalize their own experiences and definitions of a positive image. They thereby too often treated black folk-culture as primitive or the black poor as lacking virtues while promoting images of the middle class as salutary.

There are two very insightful contentions offered by Johnson to counter West’s evaluation of Harlem Renaissance scholars. The antiracism of the Renaissance authors was directed at the nearly absolute presentation of blacks as non-humans; their goal was to establish a classification of blacks as humans. Thus, as Johnson notes, “the racist misrepresentation to which the early Black cultural critics were responding was not whether any Black was male or female, rich or poor, gay or lesbian, but instead whether Blacks belonged to the same species as Whites - namely, the human species….[I]t follows that if a thing is human ceteris paribus it also is either male or female, gay or lesbian (or maybe neither), rich or poor, and so on. But the converse is not true.” (49) Foregrounding the differences within the black community and the uniqueness of each individual - something certainly a major themes among humanists - would not combat the racism faced by early cultural critiques. Unique individual humans are that if and only if they are human.

The second very insightful contention against West’s evaluation of the Harlem Renaissance offered by Johnson is that the pursuit of creating psychological fortitude among blacks, that is, battling self-loathing and encouraging self-confidence, occurred within available cultural resources. In support of Johnson, take the following into consideration: Blacks did not own companies producing ink or printing presses, let alone significant nationally circulated publications that could have been circulated without dependency on white-owned forms of transportation. If middle-class images were the ones to which the black poor considered representative of dignity, and the white infrastructure of publishing companies could be used to promote such images even while those same infrastructures were promoting images of the black as inferior, Johnson does not find such a use condemnable.

If Johnson’s major thesis is right, namely, that West is a secular humanist, then Johnson’s reading of West raises important philosophical issues for both authors.

There is clear evidence that West is a humanist. His views are anti-establishment in the sense that he warns us against the loss of individual freedom in the face of corporate greed. In West’s “Prophet Theology” (1988) he explores imago Dei, contending that Christians should hold that God identifies with all humans and, further, that there is a Christian mandate to identify with the downtrodden. An optimistic outlook, namely, that there is hope human life will improve, is characteristic of both classical humanists and West. And West is a strong advocate for rendering our ethical judgments to rational debate. I suggest below that his humanism inherits traditional philosophical problems with humanism, and I contend, contrary to Johnson’s interpretation of West, that West’s humanism is not secular.

For West, “prophetic pragmatism is compatible with religious outlooks” and non-religious outlooks because it requires speaking in truth and love, presumably, with a strong identification with the downtrodden. A prophetic pragmatist can be a Christian, Muslim, Hindu, Buddhist, B’hai or a member of any religion that endorses prophesizing. They can use naturalist explanations of events, for example, evolutionary accounts of the development of species or material-determinists accounts of motivation, to help explain social events. They can consider capitalism harmful because of Marx’s explanation of class conflict but deny that the result of class conflict, as understood by Marx as negation of the need for religion and a classless society, is human teleology. A prophetic pragmatist cannot, however, believe that human teleology is defined by the survival of the fittest, classlessness or the dialectic of consciousness resulting in absolute consciousness. In addition, a prophetic pragmatist cannot be an atheist or agnostic. The ’prophetic’ in West’s work is consistently meant to entail a spiritual meaning.

If West’s ethics are grounded in humanist values definitive of the Enlightenment, I believe, he is trapped like all humanists with the need to define “human,” and thereby, invariably, trapped in the metaphysics of grand narratives. Johnson, in Chapter 6, “Modernism, Philosophy and Race(ism)”, reviews the racism of Enlightenment philosophers such as Kant, Hume and Locke. Each considered the Negro as either an inferior human being or, like Locke, a non-human animal just below true humans and just above simple beasts. These philosophers were anthropocentric and provided a hierarchy of types of humans. West’s grand narrative is neither anti-foundationalist nor anti-metaphysical. Classical pragmatism, and especially the pragmatism of Alain Locke, the most noted pragmatist working on race during the Harlem Renaissance, is suspicious of all grand narratives - including liberal-Christian grand narratives that presaged a liberal future based on deeply Christian values such as salvation through a personal savior.

It is arguable that the one reason West consistently fails to mention Locke, although he is aware of Locke’s role in creating the Harlem Renaissance, is that Locke is an elitist of the sort West criticizes, but he is also a pragmatist who does not rely on Christian themes like grand narratives of hope for future salvation or explanations of social events that rely on a seamless web of social causes like the seamless web of causation in Christian doctrines of creation or omnipresence.

Humanist must believe, whatever else they believe, that humans are natural beings and thereby due goods associated with their species, for example, dignity, the use of reason, sex, nourishing food, etc. One important way that humanists differ is that some are naturalists -believing that every property of persons is continuous with or explainable by properties, terms, meanings, and facts offered by natural science and thereby subject to the regime of reasons and reasonable speculation. Religionists, for example, are not naturalist because they deny that humans are wholly reducible to or explainable by such properties.

West’s secular humanism is ’secular’ in the sense that he is, like the Enlightenment authors Johnson covers, committed to an anthropocentric view of humans, but, I contend, he is not a humanist in the sense of explaining or defining humans as wholly natural beings. Johnson misses this distinction.

Johnson and West use a distinction between oppression as a matter of class and oppression as a matter of race. West does not parse oppression between class and race; Johnson thinks that the solution to racial oppression is social inclusion, however, he offers no argument that social inclusion is in any way effective to abate the history of differential material opportunities between blacks and white, let alone overcoming differences between the working and upper classes. Humanists, contrary to Johnson, are often concerned with the liberation of the human as a composite being. Arguably, West’s view of oppression is compatible with humanist traditions supportive of grand narratives.

Johnson has provided a valuable contribution to philosophy because he substantively explores the philosophy of arguably the most important American philosopher of the modern era, an untiring advocate for the uplift of the downtrodden, and a philosopher that has influenced intellectual and public life not just in North America and Europe, but in a world rarely explored by Anglo-American philosophers - the world of race - a world explored by no other modern pragmatist in such depth as Alain Locke - West’s unmentioned shadow implicitly challenging West’s approach and, along with Johnson and West, providing extremely important ways of thinking about the intersection of philosophy and life.