Corporal Punishment: A Philosophical Assessment

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Patrick Lenta, Corporal Punishment: A Philosophical Assessment, Routledge, 2018, 239pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138079991.

Reviewed by Geoffrey Scarre, Durham University


"Beating," wrote Locke at the turn of the eighteenth century, "and all other sorts of slavish and corporal punishments, are not the discipline fit to be used in the education of those we would have wise, good, and ingenuous men."[1] Patrick Lenta agrees, finding it unacceptable that in the twenty-first century there are still "reasonable people who consider the corporal punishment of children permissible" (12). The "over-arching ambition" of the present book is to persuade them to change their minds. In this highly readable study, Lenta presents a powerful moral critique of corporal punishment, supporting his philosophical arguments with a range of empirical studies by psychologists and social scientists on the effects of corporal punishment on children. One might cavil that the book's title obscures the fact that Lenta's chief concern is with the corporal punishment of children (and more particularly of children in the home) rather than with corporal punishment in general. However, no discussion of corporal punishment can afford to ignore such broader issues as the purpose and efficacy of punishment, respect for persons, dignity and degradation, rights to bodily integrity, and the use of physical force for moral ends; and here the book does not disappoint. Lenta believes that corporal punishment is never justified in any context, and several of the arguments deployed against the corporal punishment of children apply, mutatis mutandis, in other contexts too.

In Lenta's view, all corporal punishment of children by parents or guardians is a form of mistreatment that is not only immoral but also ought to be illegal. Even light or infrequent spanking or smacking is inadmissible, and any putative benefits they may be thought to produce can be achieved more effectively through other means. Adopting an interest theory of rights, Lenta contends that corporally punishing children infringes their rights in a threefold way, setting back their "interests in preservation of their mental health, in their bodily security and in not being degraded" (161). He admits that each part of this tripartite claim is liable to be disputed by people of a more conservative mindset, especially by members of senior generations who experienced corporal punishment in their youth and who insist that it "did them no harm". Against their claims, the author marshals an array of recent empirical studies which, he claims, show that even mild corporal punishment can cause children to become fearful and anxious, distrustful of the love of parents and guardians, and more likely to resort to physical violence in pursuing their own ends. Although Lenta candidly admits that not all social scientists concur in these negative conclusions, he insists that a "preponderance" of studies support the view that corporal punishment endangers children's mental health and social relationships (41-45).

There may be room for a caveat here. The ethics of experimentation preclude, as Lenta concedes, the use of controlled experiments in which one set of children is subjected to a regimen involving corporal punishment while another from an exactly similar cultural, racial or religious background is not. Hence it is difficult to be sure from the empirical studies Lenta cites to what extent the bad effects alleged to flow from corporal punishment result from the punishment itself, rather than from other aspects of the children's social background. He is very dismissive of the claims made by many older people that they suffered no harm from the mild corporal punishment they experienced in their youth; this only demonstrates, he says, "the legitimizing effect of ideological conditioning" (76). However, since it is obviously not possible to test the contemporaneous effects of physical punishment on children of past decades, one might think that the next best thing would be to consult the memories of those who formerly experienced it. Disregarding such evidence on the ground that it manifests cultural bias is seriously question-begging unless the author can show why his own (presumably different) experience is more trustworthy and less tainted by his own cultural biases.[2]

Lenta accepts that corporal punishment need not necessarily be "torturous" (Ch.4), or "abusive" (Ch.5), and it may readily be granted that any corporal punishment that is severe or sustained enough to deserve these labels is morally out of order. The pitiless or sadistic infliction of gratuitous and intense physical pain plainly has no place among acceptable modes of child-rearing (or, for that matter, the treatment of criminal offenders). But even mild corporal punishment, according to the author, sins on the score that it is a form of violence, where "physical violence is the deliberate exercise of physical force against a person or property that causes harm or damage" (85). One might question whether mild corporal punishment causes actual "harm or damage", as distinct from a short-lived physical pain. And the same question arises if the scope of "harm" is extended to cover mental suffering, for mild corporal punishment need leave no lasting psychological scars. (Indeed, mild physical punishment may seem less likely to cause mental trauma than certain other forms of force commonly used against offenders, such as the forcible restraint or strip-searching of prisoners in jails, which Lenta professes to find acceptable.) As he is not opposed to punishment in general, it is puzzling why he thinks the infliction of minor and swiftly passing physical pain should be unconditionally condemned while he is prepared to countenance other forms of punishment which inflict harsher or more prolonged suffering.

In an ideal world, children and adults would never require correction. As our world is far from ideal, the use of punishment has been defended, as Lenta explains in his opening chapter, from a number of philosophical angles: retributivist, consequentialist, and expressivist. No choice is made between these approaches, since the author is more concerned to establish that none of them can show specifically corporal punishment to be admissible. While some of his arguments aim to demonstrate that corporal punishment is unacceptable for the contingent reason that alternative modes of punishment are more effective or have fewer negative side-effects, others are meant to prove that physical punishment is categorically wrong because its infliction infringes certain fundamental rights of the person.

Space forbids a detailed discussion of Lenta's multi-pronged case against the corporal punishment of children. But a few of the most salient claims and arguments require comment. If it is true, as some of the cited empirical studies suggest, that children who are corporally punished are more likely to display aggressive behaviour, that would certainly be a black mark against it (51). But it would be useful to know more about who the studied children are, and what other social and psychological factors may affect them that do not equally influence their compeers. Might other social or psychological causes be at work here?

Lenta further objects that physical punishment engenders so much pain and fear in the child that it inhibits reflection and repentance (38-39). But this claim is very doubtful, as my own youthful experience witnesses. Being corporally punished for an offence makes the culprit take it seriously and reflect on its (and his own) wrongness, but it need not cause physical or mental anguish to do this. Equally questionable is Lenta's recourse to the slippery-slope argument that parents or teachers who begin by administering mild corporal punishment are likely to end up inflicting much harsher forms of punishment; starting with light spanking or slapping, they end up as abusive floggers or whippers. (Lenta admits that there is "a possibility of inadvertent slippage into cruelty in the case of non-physical punishments as well" but he claims, for unclear reasons, that the danger is greater in the case of the former (118).) Although naturally brutal parents are in danger of being heavy-handed and unsparing with their offspring, there seems no good reason to fear that sensible, reflective and loving parents will descend in time from spanking their children to flogging them. It is further suggested that the parent who administers a non-physical punishment such as time-out has longer to gauge the degree of the child's suffering and the effects on him or her (118). Yet, to make an ad hominem point, if physical punishment really has such deleterious effects on children as the author contends, there should be quite enough time and opportunity for the parent to measure its impact.

There are numerous places in the book where the unbiased reader may feel that corporal modes of punishment, both for children and for other offenders, are being held to higher standards of acceptability than are other modes. Curiously, the fact that corporal punishment is over quickly, which might be thought to give it an advantage over punishments which deprive the subject of liberty or privileges for lengthy periods, causing multiple frustrations, resentments and inconveniences, is not seen that way by Lenta. Nor is he in favour of allowing individuals to exercise their autonomy by choosing between corporal and alternative punishments, though he admits that some might have a preference for the former.

The impression of a double standard also shows up sharply in the Chapter 4 discussion of punishment and respect for persons, where it is claimed that, while other modes of punishment may sometimes be degrading, physical punishments always degrade, and must therefore be rejected. Yet it could be argued that any form of punishment, since it forcibly suspends subjects' autonomy and compels them to submit to the will of others, is disrespectful and demeaning. Is that enough to render all punishment morally inadmissible? A possible rejoinder is that the wrongdoer has temporarily forfeited his right to be treated with the degree or kind of respect that is normally due to him. So, while he retains a right not to be subjected to any disproportionate penalty, his rights to physical liberty or bodily integrity are temporarily inactive. However, in the author's view the right to bodily integrity is never open to suspension. Hence corporal punishment is always degrading and consequently unacceptable.

Lenta rightly says that a punishment can be degrading even where degrading is not intended; more dubiously, he claims that a punishment may be degrading even where the recipient doesn't feel degraded by it: whether or not it is degrading "will depend on its character and on its effect on the recipient" (94-9). It is rather unclear here what kind of "effect" on the recipient Lenta thinks is degrading if the recipient fails to feel degraded. And while he may be correct against myself (in an earlier publication) that acting with the intention to degrade is not sufficient to degrade (94),[3] he comes close to contradicting this when he later claims that "the discrimination involved in corporal punishment degrades children through the demeaning attitude towards them which it betrays" (98). Whether an intention to degrade is or is not enough to degrade, we should bear in mind that the vast majority of parents who physically punish their children have no intention of degrading them. But may they be doing so unawares, as Lenta thinks?

Here two remarks are called for. First, if we understand degradation as a matter of being treated without due respect, or as having one's dignity undermined, then it certainly seems possible that someone could be treated in a degrading manner yet fail to recognise the fact, provided that others of sound judgement do. Yet, second, what count as respectful or appropriate treatment and their opposites is heavily dependent on social conventions, and these can change over time. When what was deemed the non-excessive and proportionate corporal punishment of children was seen as non-degrading by people who judged soundly according to the standards of their time, were the physically-punished children nonetheless degraded, although no one then perceived that they were? Lenta would presumably say that those children were degraded, even if no one recognised the fact. Yet where there is neither an intention to degrade nor any sense on anyone's part that degradation has occurred, then it is hard to say in what the putative degradation could consist, given the absence of the seemingly required attitudes. It can be perfectly appropriate to apply our contemporary moral standards in judging our forebears, as we do when we condemn, for instance, the former blinkered attitude of acceptance of slavery and the slave-trade. But it is clearer that there can be wrong acts and attitudes that go unnoticed than that people can be treated disrespectfully without recognising themselves, or being recognised by others, as being so treated.

Perhaps, then, whether the corporal punishment of children is degrading or demeaning is relative to the standards of respectful behaviour holding at a given time. Here a distinction needs to be drawn between universal principles of rightful treatment of human beings, as Kantian ends in themselves, and transient or localised standards of what counts as respectful conduct. Conventions vary among cultures and they evolve, too, within a single culture. Children have basic rights to life, security, and the provision of those vital goods and services which, by reason of their immaturity, they cannot obtain for themselves. But there is no universally accepted blueprint for the raising of children, in part because of the marvellous variety that children exhibit, but also because the ontology of children and childhood is a work in progress, every generation having its own ideas on what children are, what they ought to be, and how best to ease their passage into adulthood.

Lenta's book is the most thoroughly argued, well documented and best-written study of the pros and cons of corporal punishment to have been written by a philosopher for many years. Whether one accepts its main conclusions or not, it has "must read" status for anyone, from professor to undergraduate student, who is interested in this topic.

[1]  John Locke, Some Thoughts Concerning Education.  5thed.  1705. A and J. Churchill.

[2]Disclosure: As a member of an older generation, I was myself occasionally subjected as a child to mild corporal punishment both at home and at school, and I believe I took no harm whatsoever from it. 

[3]Geoffrey Scarre, “Corporal Punishment”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 6, 2003, 295-316, at 311.