Corrupting the Youth -- A History of Philosophy in Australia

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James Franklin, Corrupting the Youth -- A History of Philosophy in Australia, Macleay Press, 2003, 465pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 1876492082.

Reviewed by C.A.J. Coady, University of Melbourne


In Germany once I found myself interrogated by a distinguished German philosopher, of an analytic bent, who professed amazement at the way a small country like Australia had made such an impact in academic philosophy. His puzzlement paralleled the surprise that is often expressed about the country's achievements in sport. But Australian successes in philosophy, unlike its sporting achievements, are not widely known or celebrated at home, and are nowhere near as well funded.

A history of the subject's development and flourishing Down Under might well address the question why philosophy has done so well in a country that is often perceived as cheerfully pragmatic and hedonistic. And they're the polite terms. It would also need to throw light upon the genesis of various significant philosophical ideas and movements in Australia and their relation to developments in philosophy elsewhere.

Jim Franklin's entertaining book, Corrupting the Youth, does something to address these issues, but not nearly enough. Anyone expecting a sober, balanced, comprehensive history of academic philosophy in Australia will be in for some disappointment. Franklin's style is far too lively, even at times excitable, to be characterised as sober, and there are too many gaps and too little concern for chronological sequence for the term "comprehensive" to be appropriate. The author's perspective is also highly idiosyncratic and partisan, and this produces some very strange judgements.

Nonetheless, the book is very readable (unlike some more dispassionate exercises in the history of ideas) and contains a great deal of entertaining social and cultural history and speculation that sometimes bears only a tangential relation to the development of academic philosophy in Australia. Franklin, as his title suggests, thinks of philosophy as a study and a product that can be expected to impact for good or ill on the broader social and intellectual milieu. This is surely correct, though the impact is often indirect and subtle as well as direct and dramatic. Franklin is more interested in the dramatic dimension, and it is partly for this reason that he concentrates on controversial figures like Sydney University's John Anderson, whose atheism and early left-wing tendencies made him anathema to the crusty Sydney establishment, political and religious, especially in the 1930s and 40s.

This focus of Franklin's may help explain his extraordinary bias against philosophy in Melbourne, which he sees as lacking the relevant dramatic impact. As he puts it in a somewhat childish aside: 'To Sydney eyes, the story of Melbourne philosophy is a worthy one, but perhaps lacks a certain sense of excitement. Undoubtedly, the present book is Sydneycentric. If anyone can write a book on Why Melbourne Philosophy is Interesting After All, I am all for it'. The other motivation for this sort of bias is the ancient and rather wearying rivalry between the two cities. Sydneysiders and Melbournians have a tendency to sneer at each other's accomplishments, weather, attitudes and general ambience, rather like some of the rivalries in the USA between cities like New York and Chicago, or San Francisco and Los Angeles, only more intense. The intensity is largely attributable to the fact that in a country with a small population of 20 million, roughly 7.5 million live in these two major cities. This may also help explain Franklin's lack of interest in the doings of philosophy departments elsewhere in Australia.

I shall return to the effects of Franklin's monomania about Sydney, but it should first be acknowledged that John Anderson was a remarkable philosophical and cultural figure. There is therefore some justification for Franklin's rejection of historical sequence and his beginning the book with the arrival of that young Scot as Challis Professor of Philosophy at the University of Sydney in 1927 and for elaborating the controversies in which Anderson became embroiled.

Anderson was an original philosopher with a systematic philosophy of empiricist realism that had the intoxicating capacity to give students a key to the universe and a critical apparatus for demolishing received certainties. The fact that the key was virtually incomprehensible to any but the initiated merely increased the level of intoxication and transformed the key into something more resembling a lash to whip the conventional and the staid. Anderson's early radicalism (he began as a communist sympathiser and ended as a Cold Warrior), his critique of religion and advocacy of free love, gave him a certain public notoriety and saw him censured in the New South Wales parliament in 1943 for attacking religious education. His philosophy was a curious mixture of old and new. He was much indebted to Moore and Russell's critique of idealism, emphasised logic and critical inquiry as central to philosophy, but took as his principal philosophical hero the cryptic pre-Socratic philosopher Heraclitus. Moreover, unlike Moore, and the analytic tradition that sprang from his and Russell's work, Anderson was a system-builder. He propounded a metaphysics of processes in space and time, where there was only one way of being, and therefore he denounced various other outlooks as erroneously dualistic. Though trained in mathematics, he rejected modern logic and developed his own version of traditional syllogistic. He had no time for what he thought of as the "subjectivist" obsessions with ideas, sense-data, concepts, and language that so preoccupied other philosophers; indeed, he believed that Logic was somehow identical with Reality -- to oppose propositions to reality was yet another form of dualism like splitting sense-data from objects or contrasting God with the spatio-temporal world.

Anderson was prone to disciples and, despite his declared view that everything was open to criticism, was himself immune to it and discouraged deviation from Andersonian orthodoxy. He had virtually no direct international impact, though Oxford's Gilbert Ryle after visiting Australia wrote an article, called "Logic and Professor Anderson", partly sympathetic and partly critical, in the Australasian Journal of Philosophy in 1950. Anderson boasted that he never bothered to read it. Nonetheless, although Anderson studiously disdained any acknowledgement of overseas trends in philosophy, during his reign as Challis Professor he exerted widespread influence upon generations of Sydney students. Many of Australia's best-known philosophers in the last 40 years of the twenthieth century, such as David Armstrong, David Stove, John Mackie and John Passmore, were students of Anderson, as were several outstanding poets and public figures in Australia. He also exerted an indirect influence upon Sydney "underground" culture through the Libertarian Society and its offshoot, the amorphous "push".

Franklin devotes a great deal of space to the doings of the "push", though much of it has, at best, only a strained relation to the serious history of Australian philosophy. The "push" was a group of bohemians, writers, and artists who fed off the ideas of the university's Libertarian Society. This society had adapted Anderson's philosophy (or distorted it, as he thought) to promote a lifestyle centred on sex, drink, drugs, and gambling. The push provided some early excitement for young intellectuals like Germaine Greer and Richard Neville. On this basis, Franklin makes ambitious claims about the push's wider philosophical influence. The most extraordinary is his taking seriously the idea that they had some major part in bringing about "the Sixties". Their attitudes certainly matched some that became widespread in the counter-cultural Sixties, but the idea that their hand-me-down Andersonianism had some causal role in that worldwide phenomenon is beyond the far-fetched.

Franklin's Sydney obsessions also help account for something otherwise puzzling in the book, namely, the space he devotes to "Catholic philosophy", meaning by this the dense neo-Thomism embodied in Sydney's Aquinas Academy. Franklin, himself a Catholic though not conspicuously Thomistic in his philosophical thinking, notes the under-representation of Thomist thought in Australian universities, and suggests that it arises from some sort of prejudice. But there are other more plausible explanations. To begin with, Australian departments were not unusual in having little taste for the often-arcane complexities of the Thomistic movement; throughout the English-speaking philosophical world, there were few dedicated Thomists to be found in secular philosophy departments. So what prejudice exists is hardly local to Australia. And we must distinguish "official" Thomism from "Catholic philosophy" or an interest in St. Thomas's philosophy or in medieval philosophy more generally. The Catholic Church's declaring Thomism its "official" philosophy tended to produce intellectual rigidity in manifestations of Thomism, giving it something like the status of Marxism in the Communist world. True, there were genuine intellectuals who called themselves Thomists, like Maritain and Gilson, as nowadays Finnis, Grisez, and Boyle, but the movement as a whole resembled an enclosed ideology. This made it certain that genuine concern for the diverse heritage of scholastic philosophy would have some difficulty being taken seriously in university philosophy departments. (For American readers, it is worth noting that, until a few years ago, there were no Catholic universities, indeed no private universities, in Australia.) The Thomists Franklin highlights mostly chose academic isolation as a vantage point from which they could launch ignorant denunciations.

Indeed, the prejudice story needs to account for the fact that Catholics had no trouble securing positions in most university philosophy departments as long as they could make genuine philosophical contributions. At one stage in the 1970s, the University of Melbourne Department had five Catholics on the tenured lecturing staff out of a total of 14. This was a peak figure but the Catholic presence was substantial for many years before and after, so there was clearly no veto on Catholics as such in Melbourne or throughout the country, at least from the 1960s. Franklin is aware of such matters, but he has some lingering, romantic attachment to the insulated certainties of official Thomism. In fact, one of the Melbourne staff at that time was Vernon Rice, a thoroughgoing Thomist, whose existence merits only an off-hand footnote in Franklin's story -- he was in "optimistic, pompous Melbourne" after all. And it was at the University of Melbourne that the serious teaching of medieval philosophy was introduced into Australia by another Catholic, Max Charlesworth, a fact that receives only passing mention. Things were different in Sydney, where the Aquinas Academy had been set up specifically to combat Anderson's influence and seclude young Catholics from the dangers of secular philosophy, though even in the Sydney University philosophy department, the Rector of a university residential hall, St. John's Catholic College, Fr. John Burnheim, was appointed to a tenured lectureship while still a priest (he later left the Church in the wake of "Humanae Vitae").

One of Franklin's more surprising forays into the influence of philosophy upon cultural and social history occurs in his chapter entitled "Mind, Matter, and Medicine Gone Mad". This begins as a semi-technical account of the philosophy commonly known as "Australian materialism" and then tries to link this movement to various trends in medicine, especially those that involve the use of drugs to treat mental illness. This leads Franklin to some more exciting stuff, most notably the career of the notorious Dr. Harry Bailey, whose "deep sleep therapy" in Sydney in the 1950s caused the deaths of many patients and who committed suicide while a Royal Commission was investigating him. The connection of any form of philosophical materialism with these events is slim at most. On virtually any account of the mind/body problem, the fact that drugs can influence psychology and behaviour is hardly contestable, and the irresponsible use of drugs in pursuit of careerist glory or even from partly laudable motivations can hardly be laid convincingly at the doorstep of some technical philosophy of mind.

Several other chapters devoted to social history are pretty remote from the history of Australian philosophy. This is particularly notable in the chapter on "Idealism and Empire". It contains some good discussion and criticism of the technical philosophy of idealism, but Franklin's thesis that the philosophy of idealism played some profound role in imperial ideology requires an interpretation of idealism that moves it far from its philosophical base. Just because many imperialists and philosophical idealists shared an optimistic belief in progress, and both talked a lot about ideals, we cannot conclude that the imperial ideology was idealist at its core. Indeed, James and John Stuart Mill were enthusiastic about the British Empire, as were British intellectuals of all persuasions, yet no one could really treat them as idealists.

Some of the most striking contributions of Australian philosophy have come in such areas as the metaphysics of mind, unusual logics, and applied philosophy. Franklin discusses these (the second cursorily) but doesn't really explain why they have arisen and flourished. He also neglects too much the interplay between significant figures and critics, in Australia and overseas, mostly summarising accurately the published views of the main players. His discussion of ethics and applied ethics is predominantly about bioethics and it is a curiosity that three of the four philosophers he discusses at some length are Melbournians -- Alan Donagan, Peter Singer, and Rai Gaita. Indeed, so "interesting" are two of these that Franklin becomes passionately engaged in objecting to Singer's views on infanticide and in supporting Gaita's objections to the drift of much bioethics. He raises some genuine objections to Singer's position on this matter, but largely ignores Singer's very significant impact in two other areas: the morality of our treatment of animals and our moral responsibility for the alleviation of suffering beyond our own shores.

Like many philosophers, Franklin is rather addicted to "-isms" and exclusive oppositions between them. As the caustic, right-wing Sydney philosopher David Stove is the primary personal hero of the story, so the philosophy of realism, viewed as typically Australian, is the principal theoretical good guy. Against its yardstick, Franco-feminism, post-structuralism, and various other "idealisms" are found wanting. Often, Franklin has legitimate targets in view and succeeds in wittily demolishing them. But genuine philosophical debates between realists and their critics are a lot deeper, subtler and more interesting than Franklin's polemical stance would suggest, just as the landscape of philosophical options is more varied and differently contoured than his picture indicates.

A great weakness in the book is its almost complete neglect of social and political philosophy, for which Franklin apologises in a bibliographical section notable for its chaotic organisation. This neglect is particularly surprising given the book's strong emphasis upon social and political issues. And there is no discussion of Australian contributions to epistemology. But in spite of its defects, Franklin's book is immensely readable and wears its considerable erudition lightly.