Cosmopolitan War

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Cécile Fabre, Cosmopolitan War, Oxford University Press, 2012, 309pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199567164.

Reviewed by Uwe Steinhoff, University of Hong Kong


Cécile Fabre sets out to devise a "systematic book-length cosmopolitan theory of the just war" (3). She tries to do so by discussing different kinds of wars: wars of national self-defense, subsistence wars, civil wars, humanitarian intervention, "commodified wars" (i.e., mercenarism), and asymmetrical wars. The book is detailed and sophisticated, with discussions of shields and deception in war that are excellent and original. However, the book suffers from serious shortcomings, in particular from the fact that Fabre simply takes for granted certain assumptions that are highly contested in present-day just war theory instead of properly supporting them by argument. In addition, her central cosmopolitan premise is a mere fiat, in spite of her claim that she has "provided a defence" (283) for it.

"Cosmopolitanism," according to Fabre, "is the view that human beings are the fundamental and primary loci for moral concern and respect and have equal moral worth" (16). The question Fabre does not answer, however, is why we should accept cosmopolitanism. After all, it would appear that Adolf Hitler and Albert Schweitzer did not have equal moral worth: the moral worth of philanthropic medical doctors by far outstrips the moral worth of genocidal dictators. This is certainly how the average person sees it. Egalitarians tend to react to this obvious objection by leaving the ordinary language sense of "moral worth" behind and inventing a new meaning or a new "kind" of "moral worth." However, it should be clear that whatever "moral worth" in this new sense is, it cannot be of great normative significance if Hitler and Schweitzer possess it equally.

Moreover, the connection Fabre seems to see between equal moral worth and equal concern and respect is not really there: parents can consistently think that their own and other people's children have equal moral worth and that they owe their own children more concern than others' children. Fabre, however, endorses a "principle of fundamental equality whereby individuals have equal moral worth and should treat one another with equal concern and respect" (20). Yet, even if it were true that culpable serial rapists on the one hand and their innocent victims on the other had equal moral worth, it would still most certainly not be true that a caring brother owes his nice sister and her sadistic rapist equal respect and concern. In fact, he does not even owe the same concern to nice strangers as he owes his sister. As the self-avowed cosmopolitan Thomas Pogge correctly states: "Human beings need to have the option, at least, to have special relationships with friends and family that cause their conduct to be at variance with the cosmopolitan requirement of impartiality. . . . So, ethical cosmopolitanism strictly conceived is a non-starter."[1] In other words, the idea that persons owe each other equal respect and concern is out of the question.

Fabre seems to realize this herself, stating that

individuals are permitted to confer greater weight on their own goals, projects, and attachments . . . once the needy have . . . opportunities [for a minimally decent life], and when securing such opportunities for them would require of the better off to sacrifice their own opportunities for a minimally decent life. (21)

Moreover, Fabre does not just allow for this "personal prerogative" (39) but also accepts an obligation to care more for those near and dear than for strangers (38). Thus, she simultaneously makes the following three claims: that "individuals . . . should treat one another with equal concern and respect" (20), that "if I cannot save both my father and Archbishop Fenelon . . . I may, indeed must, choose the former" (38), and that persons are allowed to care more about themselves than about others under certain circumstances. This triad is incoherent.

From an incoherent position everything follows -- ex falso quodlibet -- and consequently Fabre's conclusions often look quite arbitrary: when the absurdity of the "equal respect and concern"-premise threatens to lead to equally absurd conclusions, Fabre immediately falls back onto the "personal prerogative." (The discussion on 89f. is a particularly obvious example: there she uses the prerogative to justify an instrumental, as it were, form of patriotic partiality). When arguing against (non-instrumental) compatriot favoritism, however, she does not mention the personal prerogative. To wit, she argues that your relation to your compatriots is not like your relation to your father and can therefore not confer a special obligation towards your compatriots upon you (38). She might be right about this. Yet, if "individuals are permitted to confer greater weight on their own goals, projects, and attachments," why then should someone with liberal-nationalist goals, projects, and attachments not be at least permitted to be partial towards her compatriots (whether this partiality instrumentally promotes her own rights or not)? Fabre ignores this question.

Given that her position is not genuinely "cosmopolitan" in the first place (since, as we saw, it incorporates principles that are not compatible with cosmopolitanism as defined by her), it is not surprising that her just war theory looks strangely familiar -- although her "book-length cosmopolitan theory of the just war" is supposed to be something new (3). She indeed admits that many of her conclusions might not differ that much from other accounts of just war theory, but nevertheless claims "that many of the justifications" that she provides "in support of those conclusions markedly differ from those advanced by non-cosmopolitans" (11). In fact, however, many of her justifications hardly differ from the ones that have been provided by, in particular, Jeff McMahan -- who is certainly not a cosmopolitan: he subscribes neither to the doctrine of "equal moral worth" nor to the principle of equal concern and respect.[2] What, then, is so cosmopolitan about Fabre's Cosmopolitan War?

Less familiar to many readers, but also neither innovative nor particularly cosmopolitan, is Fabre's rejection of the criterion of legitimate authority (112-118 and 141-156) and her claim "that individuals can wage war in a private capacity" (155). I provided a sustained argument to the same effect without embracing cosmopolitanism a while ago.[3] (Her discussion of mercenarism or "commodified" warfare, for that matter, also essentially repeats points that have already been made by others.) Fabre provides not even one reference to this argument (although she mentions the book where it is to be found in other contexts), nor does she add anything to it, apart from an inconsistency and an unwarranted qualification. The inconsistency -- which she notes, but does not remedy (145-46) -- consists in the fact that her own official definition of "war" (2) is incompatible with individual war. The unwarranted qualification is her claim that:

insurgents may take matters into their own hands, subject to two conditions: they have good reason to believe that their fellow community members would consent if they could,and they put in place institutional mechanisms whereby those for whose sake they fight can hold them into account once the war is over. (155)

However, people can defend their own rights and they do not need the consent of their community to do so. In addition, people, including insurgents, are allowed (provided certain other just war criteria are fulfilled and barring special circumstances) to defend others against an aggressor even if the people being defended do not want this help. Self- and other-defense, after all, are not only about defending individual rights, but also about defending the legal or moral order.[4]

Coming back to Fabre's stipulations: she claims that individuals are under a negative duty "not to take part in structured and organized practices the effect of which are severely harmful to others" (30). She gives no justification or further explanation of this claim but seems to simply accept (a version of) Christopher Kutz's account of collective responsibility. Yet, again, the question is why one should accept such an account. Are we really supposed to assume that taking part in the structured activity of producing kitchen knives is a violation of a negative duty since it has effects that are severely harmful to others (for example the effect that some people are murdered with kitchen knives)? Given her endorsement of an entirely implausible example from Kutz (30), this seems to be precisely what she has in mind. (If, however, this is not what she has in mind, it has to be said that she fails to properly explain what she does have in mind.) Once we accept such a sweeping account of collective responsibility, there are few jobs left in the industrialized world that we could do without violating negative duties.

Furthermore, Fabre also explains that whether people who violate such supposed negative duties "are liable to being targeted depends on whether their contributions to those practices and policies themselves constitute a wrongful harm when taken on their own" (158). But if that is so, then what do we need collective responsibility for in the first place? Why not just consider the acts on their own? Moreover, Fabre's account of liability to attack is untenable: if A, B, and C each pour a different chemical over an innocent person knowing full well, and jointly intending, that the combination of these chemicals will result in a chemical reaction leading to the innocent person's death, then all three of them are clearly liable to attack, whether each of their actions taken "on their own" will result in the death of the innocent person or not. The target of their attempted murder is allowed to shoot any of them if necessary to save his life.

In light of these considerations Fabre's gradations of liability are arbitrary. For instance, she claims that "devising on paper the regime's genocidal plan . . . might well make one liable" while "the mere act of supporting an illegitimate regime (for example, by voting in its favor) does not suffice to make a citizen liable to attack" (158). She again provides no argument for these claims, which is not surprising: after all, devising a plan is "on its own" no more harmful than voting. Moreover, her further claim that the citizen's voting "might, however, make him liable to incurring a harm lesser than death, and/or widely liable to being killed foreseeably (albeit unintentionally)" (158) is not backed up by argument, either.

Unlike most other just war theorists, Fabre addresses the important question "whether, and if so, under what conditions, the very deprived have the right to wage war against the foreign affluent if the latter violate subsistence rights" (97). She thinks that the "very deprived" do have such subsistence rights against "the affluent" (ch. 1), and she seems to accept -- in line with her account of collective responsibility -- the Poggean argument that most of the affluent are also derelict in their negative duties towards the global poor (102). Her answer to the question is therefore that the poor are under certain conditions (basically those of necessity and proportionality) indeed justified in waging a war against "the affluent" to enforce the latter's duties (128). Moreover, in line with her rejection of the criterion of legitimate authority, such a war "may be fought by those [very deprived] individuals acting singly" (116). Fabre also states that even those affluent persons that are not liable to the infliction of lethal harm might still "be liable to the infliction of non-lethal harm" (126), and that other means than war should be used to enforce the affluents' duties "if those alternative means are effective" (129). She further makes the claim that if an act of wrongdoing provides the victim with a just cause for using non-lethal force against the wrongdoer, then the victim gains a right to use lethal force in case the wrongdoer himself uses lethal (or sufficiently severe) means in reaction to the non-lethal force of the victim (70).

These claims taken together, however, have implications that many will find extremely troubling and counter-intuitive -- at the very least they are worth spelling out: a "very deprived" person (or an agency acting on the behalf of the very deprived) can now come to the country of the affluent, pick out an affluent person (who in all likelihood will be derelict in her positive duties towards the poor on Fabre's account), steal from her or assault her with a gun to get her money, and shoot her if the situation escalates. It would seem that Fabre's account justifies non-violent and violent criminality on a massive scale. It can be doubted that such an account really paints an adequate picture of what justice allows and requires.

Given Fabre's account of subsistence rights and the positive duties of the affluent to help the poor (up to a certain point), she rightly insists that the moral opportunity costs, as it were, of a war, in particular of humanitarian intervention, also have to be taken into consideration:

account must also be taken of the use to which the resources could be put if the war were not waged: If the choice, therefore, is between rescuing 800,000 people from genocide and saving 18 million people from starvation, perhaps we should do the latter: as I noted in Section 2.4, our positive duties of justice to provide material assistance to the needy might sometimes trump our negative duties not to harm the innocent. (175)

While the part of this statement before the colon is correct and important, the part after the colon is confused. To wit, while the genocidal aggressor violates a negative duty with his aggression, the potential humanitarian intervener would, by not intervening, at best violate a positive duty to help. Thus, there is no conflict between a positive and a negative duty here, but at best a conflict between two positive duties. But since Fabre also states that "it is morally worse to kill the innocent than to let them die" (84) and she very well knows that the humanitarian intervener himself will in fact "inevitably harm" (and kill) some innocent people (197), it would seem that if the choice is between rescuing X people from genocide and saving X people from starvation, one should do the latter. Since, however, modern war is extremely expensive, while, in comparison, saving people from starvation is not, there will always be this choice. In that case, however, the permissibility of humanitarian intervention (at least under modern circumstances) must -- on grounds of Fabre's very own premises but much against her intentions -- be denied.

In fact, it would seem that the genocidal aggressor who is in the process of exterminating 20,000 people now has a justification to fight against the potential humanitarian intervener if the latter lets a million people starve although he could easily save them. After all, Fabre affirmatively quotes Terry Nardin saying that "a murderer is not forbidden to save a drowning child" (189). Then, it would seem, a genocidal aggressor is not forbidden to save the starving by making the rich abide by their duties. Given that Fabre believes in the moral inequality of combatants, the rich would not even be allowed to fight back (provided the genocidal regime abides by the ius ad bellum and ius in bello requirements in its beneficent fight against the rich).

Fabre admits that she also simply "take[s] for granted" the doctrine of acts and omissions and the doctrine of double effect (14). However, to take the controversial doctrine of double effect for granted in a discussion about the comparative wrongness of intentionally targeting innocents as opposed to killing them unintentionally (239-256) is question-begging. On the other hand, Fabre is not an absolutist deontologist, but a threshold deontologist (13); she allows the intentional targeting of innocents if and only if this would be necessary to avoid (or stop) a genocide, totalitarianism, or mass enslavement (253-256). Yet, again, she provides no argument as to why it should only be allowed in these cases. Given her remarks about subsistence wars and her endorsement of the claim that numbers count (247-252), one should assume that if avoiding the genocide of 20,000 people merits the direct targeting of civilians, then avoiding the starvation of 20,000,000 people merits it too.

Another issue that requires more argument is Fabre's stance on the extremely controversial topic of the moral (in)equality of combatants. She takes the position that the combatants on the "just" and the "unjust" side of a war do not have equal freedom to kill each other (71-81). Rather, the combatants on the unjust side have to lay down their arms. Fabre states that she does not want to consider "the various moves and counter-moves" of the participants in this debate "in depth" (73). But even so, given that the moral inequality thesis is a central and foundational premise of her whole account, a somewhat stronger and more detailed defense of it would have been called for. The two paragraphs in which she tries to allay the suspicion that certain of her very own assumptions might in fact imply the moral equality of combatants are particularly unconvincing (94-95).

Finally, Fabre's whole account of just war theory relies on "the right to kill in self-defence and the right to kill in defence of others" (55). Yet there is extreme controversy among present-day just war theorists about whether self-defense is a promising justification for killing in war. Philosophers like David Carroll Cochran, Richard Norman, and David Rodin have pointed out that self-defense is directed against ongoing or imminent attacks. However, many of the "unjust combatants" are not attacking at all, nor is their attack imminent, they might, for example, be sleeping or fleeing. I suppose that Fabre, like other just war theorists, would allow for the killing of the sleeping or fleeing combatant, but then she would have to actually engage with the debate about this issue. She does not.

Fabre's Cosmopolitan War contains some highly interesting discussions, but on the whole it relies on too many controversial assumptions that remain undefended.

[1] Thomas Pogge, "Cosmopolitanism", in Robert E. Goodin, Philip Pettit, and Thomas Pogge (eds.), A Companion to Contemporary Political Philosophy (Oxford: Blackwell, 2012), pp. 312-31, at 328.

[2] Jeff McMahan, "Challenges to Human Equality", The Journal of Ethics 12 (2008), pp. 81-104

[3] Uwe Steinhoff, On the Ethics of War and Terrorism (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007), Ch. 1; "What is War -- And Can a Lone Individual Wage One?", International Journal of Applied Philosophy 23(1) (2009b), pp. 133-150.

[4] Boaz Sangero, Self-Defence in Criminal Law (Oxford and Portland, OR: 2006), pp. 93-106.