Cosmopolitanism: A Philosophy for Global Ethics

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Stan van Hooft, Cosmopolitanism: A Philosophy for Global Ethics, Acumen, 2009, 200pp., £16.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651931.

Reviewed by Gillian Brock, University of Auckland



Cosmopolitans encourage us to consider ourselves as citizens of the world and to take this allegiance to the world community as relevant in our moral deliberations. Cosmopolitanism is often thought of as a demanding view with strong responsibilities to bring about change on a global scale. In his latest book, Cosmopolitanism: A Philosophy for Global Ethics, Stan van Hooft provides a masterfully accessible survey of various cosmopolitan positions, explaining the values, rights, and responsibilities that follow from the position in developing his own account of what cosmopolitanism entails. According to van Hooft, the “genuine outlook of ethical cosmopolitanism” (19) is characterized by no less than 21 particular features:

(1) measured endorsement of patriotism;

(2) opposition to nationalism and chauvinism;

(3) willingness to suspend narrow national interests in order to tackle global problems such as those of environmental degradation or global justice;

(4) respect for human rights as universally normative;

(5) acknowledging the moral equality of all peoples and individuals;

(6) respect for the peoples of the world as united by reason, sociability and a common humanity;

(7) belief in a globally acceptable concept of human dignity;

(8) benevolence to all others irrespective of race, caste, nationality, religion, ethnicity or location;

(9) willingness to come to the aid of those suffering from natural or man-made disasters, including extreme poverty;

(10) commitment to justice in the distribution of natural resources and wealth on a global scale;

(11) global solidarity with struggles for human rights and social justice;

(12) commitment to the liberalization of immigration and refugee policies;

(13) acknowledging the sovereignty of nation-states while insisting on limitations to that sovereignty in order to secure human rights and global justice;

(14) quest for lasting world peace;

(15) respect for the right to self-determination of peoples;

(16) preparedness to prosecute crimes against humanity internationally;

(17) acknowledging the rule of international law;

(18) commitment to open and participatory political processes globally;

(19) religious and cultural tolerance and an acceptance of global pluralism;

(20) dialogue and communication across cultural and national boundaries;

(21) seeing the world as a single polity and community. (19-20)

Van Hooft offers justification for these claims in the five chapters of the book. In chapter 1, he defends the first three. By discussing a number of well-known debates between cosmopolitans and critics more committed to patriotism or nationalism, he argues for the idea that one needs to be a patriot to be a cosmopolitan, as one must operate within one’s polity and therefore have some commitment to it. While he offers a measured endorsement of patriotism, he rejects nationalism on the grounds that it tends too easily towards obnoxious consequences such as “chauvinism, militarism, and the prioritizing of one’s national interests over global responsibilities” (54). But here van Hooft’s position does not seem to do justice to some of the more sophisticated contemporary defenses of nationalist positions (such as those of Yael Tamir and David Miller).1 As recent defenders have argued, there are forms of attachment to nations that are not necessarily obnoxious. A key issue is how non-nationals are treated, and there is no necessary connection between love of nation and ill-treatment of non-nationals. Indeed, some have argued for forms of “rooted cosmopolitanism” that show commitment to both is entirely possible.

Claims (4)-(7) are defended in Chapter 2, with the key focus being defending respect for human rights as a core feature of the cosmopolitan’s positive commitments. Van Hooft points out that the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UDHR), which was endorsed by the UN in 1948, expresses an important international consensus on member states’ aspirations concerning individuals’ social and political entitlements. The concept of human rights has been given a certain universal legitimacy through the fact that all member states of the UN have signed up to the UDHR, which “enables fruitful discourse on human rights and global justice in all parts of the world” (63). Van Hooft also provides a more philosophical justification for human rights. Here he reflects on basic elements of human life. Drawing on work of mine in which I argue that a central feature we share as human beings is that we are agents of a certain kind, van Hooft attempts to develop the argument by pointing to subjectivity as a feature of human existence that is yet more basic.2 This entails that human beings require those conditions that allow voluntary action and also those that allow reflection on our existence. Indeed, our subjectivity renders any social conditions that prevent us from reflecting on our circumstances and seeking to improve them on the basis of such reflection unjustifiable. It is in this capacity for reflection and change that “our dignity as human beings consists” (69). The conditions required for subjectivity give rise to our basic human needs, and basic human rights stem from these needs.

Chapter 3 on Global Justice defends claims (8)-(12). As in other chapters, van Hooft tries to cover considerable ground in this, perhaps too much given recent debates on especially claims (10) and (12). I note that the defense of claim 12 is particularly concise (pp. 106-109) and therefore not completely convincing as its stands. Indeed, some cosmopolitans have argued for rethinking the wisdom of liberalizing immigration policies on cosmopolitan grounds, especially if we take the well-being of those left in source countries seriously.3 Having read the chapter eagerly awaiting a clear statement of the content of (10), or an argument concerning it, it is not clear exactly what commitment to justice in the distribution of natural resources and wealth on a global scale amounts to from the van Hooftian perspective. I suspect it would be “sufficientarian” given the arguments of chapter 2 and perhaps linked to adequate resourcing for human rights, but this could certainly be clarified. The chapter focuses rather too much on the morality of rescue (especially Peter Singer’s arguments) and the framework of justice versus the ethic of caring. However, some of that focus seems a bit dated now.

Chapter 4 on “Lasting Peace” deals with claims (13)-(16). In defense of these ideas he considers issues such as sovereignty, world government, and humanitarian intervention. Drawing on the work of Henry Shue, he argues that gross violations of human rights are better dealt with through appropriate police action to rescue victims and prosecute rights-violators than through recourse to military action.4 Police power can be a legitimate tool that cosmopolitans can rightfully use to protect human rights.

Chapter 5, “Towards a global community”, tackles the remaining claims. Here van Hooft argues that a global community already exists in a rudimentary form, but it can be further refined to realize better cosmopolitan aspirations.

Overall, the book is a good introduction to a rich field, with an enormous and increasing literature. As the catalog of claims above makes clear, there is much ground covered and this reasonably concise book will greatly assist those unfamiliar with key views in the debate. It would be ideal for adoption in courses both at undergraduate and graduate levels, but scholars unfamiliar with the field will also find this a useful guide. The chief strengths of the book are its accessibility and breadth, though van Hooft also offers important contributions to the literature at a number of points, perhaps especially in chapter 2.

However, there is still work to be done on those central arguments in chapter 2 before they can ground the normative claims van Hooft believes follow from our human nature. Some of the trouble appears when he tries to derive some normative claims from some descriptive ones. This is his basic strategy:

1. Human nature is defined by what gives dignity and worth to human life “by fulfilling that nature” (79).

2. The description of human nature is, according to van Hooft, already a normative one. [He thereby aims to have circumvented the so-called “naturalistic fallacy”.]


3. All people should have what is needed to exercise their human capabilities, specified in (1).

4. People need resources to exercise those capabilities.


5. Institutions and individuals should not prevent the exercise of the relevant capabilities and moreover should provide “whatever assistance or resources are needed for such exercise” (79).

6. Obligations and rights are symmetrical.

7. From 5 and 6, he concludes that all human beings have a right to have their needs met (though it is a further question how we allocate obligations with respect to those rights).

If human nature described in premise 1 is already a normative account, then it might escape the so-called naturalistic fallacy, but perhaps at the expense of being highly contestable. After all the history of philosophy is replete with philosophers arguing for different accounts (both descriptive and prescriptive) of our human nature or what gives dignity and worth to human life. The staunch libertarian, for instance, might say (and indeed has said) that what gives dignity and worth to human life is independence and self-sufficiency; therefore what is most consistent with such a view is an account whereby the only rights that are justified are (so-called “negative”) rights to non-interference. While I do not find such libertarian arguments at all convincing, they are unfortunately quite popular, so van Hooft may need to do more to convince such opponents of the plausibility of his preferred normative account of human nature, and the entitlements that follow from it.

1 See, for instance, David Miller, Citizenship and National Identity (Polity Press, 2000); David Miller, National Responsibility and Global Justice (Oxford UP, 2007); Yael Tamir, Liberal Nationalism (Princeton UP, 1993).

2 Gillian Brock, “Egalitarianism, Ideals, and Cosmopolitan Justice” Philosophical Forum 36 (2005): 1-30; Gillian Brock, Global Justice: A Cosmopolitan Account (Oxford UP, 2009).

3 For some treatment of this, see for instance Brock, Global Justice, chapter 8.

4 Henry Shue, “Conditional Soveriengty” Res Publica 8 (1999): 1-7.